At the Edges of Thought: Deleuze and Post-Kantian Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Craig Lundy and Daniela Voss (eds.), At the Edges of Thought: Deleuze and Post-Kantian Philosophy, Edinburgh University Press, 2015, 337pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780748694631

Reviewed by Eugene Holland, Ohio State University


The editors' Introduction to this collection is divided into two parts. The first identifies three areas of intersection between Deleuze's thought and post-Kantian philosophy: synthetic-constructive method; the Idea or Absolute; Aesthetics. The second part provides a summary of each of the volume's fifteen essays, which are grouped into three sections. The three areas of intersection presented in the Introduction do not correspond in any obvious way to the three sections of the volume, which are arranged chronologically (according to the Post-Kantian figure being examined). Ideally, a book review might bring these two triads into alignment, were the book not a collection of essays with the avowedly "modest" aim of identifying just "some [of the] significant common problems and interests that link Deleuze in various ways to the diverse tradition of post-Kantian thought" (p.4, with my emphasis). This aim is achieved thanks to the uniformly high quality of the contributions, which -- their range of topics aside -- vary mostly in how much knowledge they presuppose the reader possesses of particular post-Kantians' terminology and arguments, including Deleuze's own. Together, they help situate Deleuze not so much in relation to the mavericks of the Western philosophical tradition with whom he has usually (and not incorrectly) been associated -- Spinoza, Nietzsche, Bergson, for example, although these figures are mentioned here, too -- but in relation to canonical figures of that tradition, including Fichte, Hegel, Feuerbach, Schopenhauer, and Husserl. Whether by way of clarifying sources, identifying parallel lines of thought, or highlighting contrasting positions, the essays (too numerous to summarize individually here) succeed admirably in showing why Deleuze occupies such an important place in Western thought.

One of the reasons for Deleuze's importance is that he renews or indeed completes the critical project lying at the heart of modern Western philosophy; that of Kant, as many of the authors here insist. This entails, most obviously, replacing Kantian presuppositions of identity and harmony among the faculties with difference and discord, but it also involves critically reconstructing the transcendental field without recourse to the regulative ideas of God, transcendent self and stable world (being). The aim is to move beyond establishing the formal conditions of all possible experience to investigate the real genesis of actual experience. Deleuze will thus replace Kant's transcendental idealism with a "transcendental empiricism" -- an empiricism that does not accept as point of departure the given as it is recognized by common sense, but that becomes transcendental by focusing instead on the intensive processes by which the given is given to experience to begin with. The collection thus opens with a set of essays devoted to the relations among Kant, Deleuze, and Salomon Maimon, probably the least well-known of the consequential post-Kantians, but certainly among the most important for Deleuze.

Maimon was the first to insist that a transcendental philosophy account not merely for the conditions of possible experience, but for the genesis of real experience. What's more, he provides a means of doing so: drawing on Leibniz and the calculus, Maimon substitutes imperceptibly small differentials for Kant's thing-in-itself; they are the noumena which give rise to the phenomena we can perceive. This substitution also closes the gap between active understanding and passive sensibility (which Kant fills in with schematism): for Maimon, intuition and understanding have the same source, a divine understanding only part of which human understanding can grasp in concepts and obscurely sense through intuition. Combining Maimon and Leibniz with Albert Lautman, Simondon and structuralism, Deleuze replaces Maimon's differential noumena divinely conceived with differentially-structured ("differentiated") virtual Ideas (or Problems) that give rise through "dramatization" or "differentiation" to actual experience. Maimon's divine idealism is thus banished by Deleuze (along with Spinoza's third kind of knowledge) in favor of a "superior" empiricism designed to explain genetically how the empirically given is given to experience in terms of the immanent relation between virtual and actual. Departing from both Kant and Maimon, Deleuzian Ideas are not mental, but real -- though they can give rise to concepts and sensations (as in philosophy and art). And his newly reconstructed transcendental field ("plane of immanence") comprises a heterogeneous multiplicity of Problems (Ideas) that both constitute experience and provoke thought.

The contribution of Part II is harder to summarize, although its six essays do all bear on members of the first generation of post-Kantians: Fichte, Hegel, Hölderlin, and Wilhelm von Kleist. At first blush, taking an idealist philosopher such as Fichte who emphasized the identity of the self as a precursor to Deleuze may seem far-fetched, especially since Deleuze rarely mentions him. But two essays make a convincing case here that, particularly in his later work, Fichte explores important terrain shared with Deleuze. Like Maimon in at least one respect, Fichte's endeavor to complete the Kantian project retained the emphasis on immanence and aimed to uncover the genesis of real experience rather than the conditions of possible experience. And despite his early emphasis on the self, Fichte considered the most important aspect of thought itself to be impersonal and pre-representational, like Deleuze, and favored intuition and the imagination (and Kant's third Critique) over logic and the first Critique. In the late diaries which have only recently been published, moreover, it becomes clear that for Fichte the transcendental was to be located no longer in a self, but in life itself -- and indeed it is in Deleuze's final essay, "Immanence: A Life", that Fichte is explicitly named in precisely this connection.

If Deleuze's similarities with Fichte are surprising, the contrasts with Hegel are not; what is surprising is rather how much Deleuze and Hegel have in common. One essay argues that (as far as The Logic of Sense is concerned, and perhaps no farther) they share an expressivist view of action and agency, whereby the sense of an action is not determined by the action itself, nor by the intention of the first-person actor alone, but by the interactions between the action and its consequences, the first-person perspectives on them (before and after the act occurs) and third-persons perspectives on them (after it occurs). The key difference then lies in the ethical consequences Hegel and Deleuze will draw from such a shared view: important for Hegel is the reconciliation or "recognitive mediation" of disparate first- and third-person perspectives, which will ultimately arrive at a shared public sense adequate to the original action; for Deleuze, such disparity confronts the actor as a problem, a "crack in thought" which calls for a creative response to the act's consequences and interpretations through "counter-actualization".

The other essay on Hegel contrasts their understandings of ethics by focusing on the germinal role that desire plays in both their political philosophies. In both the Phenomenology of Spirit and the Philosophy of Right, desire fuels a dialectic of mediation and sublation/overcoming whereby disparate impulses (whether within the individual or among individuals) are reconciled in a higher unity of freedom as self-determination where diverse contents finally achieve a form adequate to them. The regime and tools of work, which holds desire in check, and the figure of the civil servant, who expresses the universal interests of the community, are key elements of this dialectic for Hegel, to which Deleuze and Guattari oppose metallurgists, who use tools to produce weaponry that can threaten the interior unity of the State with the nomadic exteriority of the war machine. Whereas the metallurgist creates and occupies a holey space that communicates with both the striated space of interiority of the worker-citizen and civil servant and the smooth space of the warrior, the war-machine itself remains external to the State and (its) reason (raison d'état). While the purportedly superior rationality of Ethical Life in the State finds its ultimate justification according to Hegel in war, Deleuze and Guattari propose an alternative regime of nomadic desire whose objective is war only when it must defend its exteriority from State capture.

The relation between State and war-machine is further developed in the essay on Kleist, where they are considered two abstract poles of any political assemblage whatsoever rather than separate entities in their own right. Kleist considered Kant's insistence on an a priori distinction between sensibility and empirical content on one hand and intelligibility and transcendent form on the other to be a fatal flaw in his philosophy, one that was conducive to State thought (raison d'état). Kleist wrote to replace this hylomorphic view with a hylozoism whereby matter is immanently self-forming and thinking is driven by affect, by the ability to affect and be affected by the external world. State thought supports the exercise of power by limiting affect (through over-coding and territorialization); the war-machine tries to break through and break down State limits in order to enable affect to vary and multiply. The essay on Hölderlin, finally, shows how much Deleuze's theory of time is indebted to the German poet, and serves additionally as a solid basis for the last essay, which is devoted to the time-image in cinema.

If Part II was difficult to summarize, Part III is practically impossible, as it ranges from early nineteenth-century post-Kantians (Schopenhauer and Feuerbach) through twentieth-century philosophers who are post-Kantian mostly in a chronological sense (Husserl and Lyotard) to a late twentieth-century film-maker who may be post-Kantian only in Deleuze's reading of him (Michelangelo Antonioni). Schopenhauer is no doubt the least surprising of these figures, given his importance for Nietzsche and Nietzsche's importance for Deleuze. The very title of Schopenhauer's major work already suggests its appeal for Deleuze and his critique of the dominant philosophical image of thought: the world is not just a matter of representation, but also of will -- a perspective that eventually contributes, by way of the will-to-power, to the concept of desiring-production in Anti-Oedipus. Equally attractive, though, is Schopenhauer's favoring intuitive over conceptual knowledge, based (as it is, in part, for Deleuze, too) on a reading of Kant's third Critique. Kant had earlier (in the second Critique) defined desire as the faculty that brings objects into being by means of representations, but for Schopenhauer, will is no longer subordinate to representation. Similarly for Deleuze and Guattari (adding Marx, Nietzsche and Freud into the equation), desire is no longer fixed on objects as represented and therefore lacking, but produces its objects, instead: desiring-production produces, and what it produces is real. More surprising is the convincing case made for Feuerbach as an important precursor for Deleuze's critique of the image of thought. Although best known as a critic of Hegel, Feuerbach was in fact criticizing an entire tradition (reaching at least as far back as Descartes) in which a certain form of presentation of thought obscures or prevents thinking itself, just as the image of thought does according to Deleuze. Feuerbach is nonetheless criticized in turn for retaining the Kantian separation between intuition and understanding, which Deleuze will overcome by insisting on the passive nature of synthesis and by construing the transcendental field as containing the genetic conditions of real experience, as we have seen.

As the later essays move farther away in time from the immediately post-Kantian period, Deleuze moves closer to center-stage. The essay on Kant, Deleuze and Husserl, while usefully also treating Fichte, Hegel, and even Leibniz along the way, explores Deleuze's theory of time in relation to the decision, showing how the formula 'object = X' can be extended from objects to language, the unconscious, history, and finally to ethics. The essay on Deleuze and Lyotard suggests that they both favor the third Critique and particularly the sublime over the beautiful because of the way modernist art has pursued Rimbaud's program of "disordering the senses" (and by extension, the faculties) so that art itself has replaced Nature (as it appeared in Romantic post-Kantianism) as the epitomic object of aesthetics. The final essay, on Antonioni, confirms this suggestion, if we take Antonioni's later films as his most modernist, and reinforces arguments made earlier (in the essays on Hölderlin and Husserl) for the central importance of time both in Kant and in Deleuze's completion of the Kantian project. Drawing on Deleuze's 1978 Kant Seminar and the second volume of the cinema books, the essay shows how the evolution of twentieth-century cinema culminating in the time-image of Antonioni (among others) recapitulates the revolution in Western philosophy launched by Kant's elevation of time to transcendental status and the reversal of its subordination to movement.

While a degree of conceptual elasticity may sometimes be required of readers to accept the parallelisms being proposed here between Deleuze and his precursors (particularly regarding Hegel), both for Deleuzians interested in better understanding how Deleuze fits into the Western philosophical tradition and for philosophers interested in better understanding Deleuze, I know of no better anthology than this one.