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Eleonore Stump, Atonement, Oxford University Press, 2019, 538pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198813866.

Reviewed by Rolfe King, University of Aberdeen


Eleonore Stump's book sets out a major, original account of the Christian doctrine of the atonement. Philosophers and thinkers interested in love, God, forgiveness, guilt, punishment, shame, moral psychology, mind-reading and empathy will find much of interest.

In traditional Christian thought, atonement relates to God overcoming, through Christ, the problem of human sin, and restoring us to loving relationship with him. There have many attempts to account for this, and Stump's book offers her own proposal. She finds the Patristic understanding of atonement, based on Christ somehow redeeming us from slavery to Satan, unable to explain the removal of guilt or shame. Stump focusses on the Anselmian approach and that of Aquinas. Anselmian accounts see the main obstacle to atonement as something in God, whereas Aquinas's approach sees the main obstacle as something in human beings. Stump's proposal draws extensively on Aquinas.

Anselmian accounts suppose

that God is somehow required by his honor or goodness or justice or some other element of his goodness to receive reparation, penance, satisfaction, or penalty to make up for human wrongdoing as a condition for forgiving sinful human beings and accepting reconciliation with them. (71)

Stump is strongly opposed to Anselmian accounts, under which she also includes the penal theory, that Christ paid the penalty for our sin in our place in order to satisfy divine justice. As a significant part of developing her own proposal she engages in extensive critical discussion of such accounts. Her criticisms merit careful study. But space constraints require concentration on Stump's own proposal, so I just pick out a couple of points.

Stump claims that under Anselmian accounts it is the Holy Spirit, the third person of the Trinity (as Christians understand God), who sanctifies people, so 'the rest of the process resulting in the salvation of some human beings is not part of Christ's atonement. Consequently . . . Christ alone is not sufficient for salvation' (76). Christ's work of atonement is 'just the obtaining of a pardon from God for human wrongdoers' (76). But if Christ's work secures the benefits which the Holy Spirit then goes on to apply to people, then this is what makes him the Saviour within the legal framework of such accounts. There is no other name by which we can be saved. Jesus alone is the Saviour. But Anselmian accounts can hold that all the persons of the Trinity are involved in salvation, even though redemption is pre-eminently assigned to the Son of God. They can affirm that the risen Christ is now actively and continuously sending his Spirit to keep Christians in union with him, nourishing and feeding the church, drawing people towards greater holiness.

Stump thinks that the parable of the Prodigal Son should not be read in Anselmian terms, for the father would need his son to make amends before he could forgive him. But parables often focus on just one point, so this is open to question. In any case, a Jew with a belief that God is the one who provides the sacrifice of atonement might believe that his son's sins would be covered by God (provided he turned to God).

I turn now to Stump's proposal. She starts with an account of love. Drawing on Aquinas, she says that love desires: (1) the good of the beloved and (2) union with the beloved. Since union with God is the highest good, these two features converge on the main one of union with God. In Part II, Stump focusses on this union, seeing it as a mutual indwelling: atonement is about us indwelling God and God indwelling us.

She notes that 'For Aquinas, the chief obstacle to human salvation is that the human will does not will the good or even want to will the good' (23). The solution

consists in the paired processes of justification and sanctification . . . without violating human free will, God's operative grace produces in a human person a will for a will that wills the good; and God's cooperative grace works with that partially healed human will to increase in it the strength for willing the good. (23)

The main effect of Christ's passion and death for human beings was 'that of providing the grace that heals the defect in the human will through the process of justification and sanctification' (23).

Stump returns to justification and sanctification later. But an important feature for her is Aquinas's notion of the stain on the soul. This is where 'moral wrongdoing leaves the wrongdoer with defects or impairments beyond those in the wrongdoer's intellect and will' (57). Repentance over time can lead to changes in wrongful features of the agent's intellect and will. But, as she notes, there is still a problem with the stain on the soul, which even wholehearted repentance will not remove.

Stump's description of the stain on the soul indicates that it can manifest in terms of the memory of having done something evil, or a 'moral flabbiness' in the psyche, and also the impact of the revulsion which others may feel towards the person concerned). There is also a distance which the damage done to the psyche brings about between the person and God and other people, all of which involve some form of internal self-alienation. Even where repentance may heal the former damage, the latter damage, connected with those affected by the wrongdoing distancing themselves from the person, will not be directly removed by the person turning to God.

Stump has very interesting discussions of topics such as union, God's presence in time and space), mutual closeness and personal presence as humans give each other shared attention, 'mind-reading' through empathy, and how this relates to God indwelling someone. The nub of this discussion is a notion of personal presence through shared, empathetic attention. To some extent, two persons united in love can indwell one another, through an 'interweaving of their psyches . . . In the fullest expression of . . . uniting in love . . . [each person] is as second-personally present with the other as is possible between two human beings' (138). By extension, 'in the indwelling of the Holy Spirit, God is present to a person in grace with as much second-personal presence as is possible in this life. It is a union that makes the two of them one without merging one into the other ' (139).

Stump then turns to linking the concepts of mind-reading and shared attention to Christ's distance from God in his cry of dereliction on the cross. She argues that because Christ both has a divine mind and a human mind, on the cross he could mind-read all human minds, or psyches, across time and space. In so doing, a simulacrum of the stain of sin on the soul of every person was downloaded into Christ's mind on the cross.

She cites Frodo, in The Lord of the Rings, whose mind experiences great anguish and inner distortion as he mind-reads through 'a telepathic connection to the Black Riders or Sauron' (163) the horrors of their minds. For Christ, being connected 'all at once with the evil mental states of every human evildoer would great eclipse all other human psychological suffering' (164). 'Flooded with such horror, Christ might well lose entirely his ability to find the mind of God the Father' (165). A real distance arises between Christ and God for which Christ is not culpable. Christ, in his psyche, has 'a simulacrum of the stains of all the evil ever thought or done, without having any evil acts of his own and without incurring any true stain on the soul' (164).

This, for Stump, is how Christ bears our sin. This is one part of the atonement, when human beings are in Christ, and thus in God. 'Christ establishes . . . an indwelling in God of all human beings even in their sinfulness' (166). The other part is that God must come to indwell a human person. This occurs when a person turns to God, when God's Spirit enters them. This is justification, to be followed by sanctification, both fundamental to 'life in grace'.

Suffering can be a medicine which helps heal the defect in the will that keeps people resisting God, but prior to life in grace 'no-one else can fix [a person's] will . . . not even God' (200). A critical moment is 'quiescence', when a person ceases resisting God, but is also not actively choosing for God and the good. Stump affirms traditional Christian thought that no one can turn to God unless God, as the source of all movements toward the good, acts to move them. For Stump, only when someone is quiescent can God then act to move them towards initial repentance and justification. Then, as God continues to act interiorly within one, sanctification occurs through increasing repentance.

Atonement is fully completed when we are united, through the indwelling Spirit, to God in perfect love. The stain on the soul is also removed, which Stump sees as due to God forgetting people's wrongdoing, not literally, but because they are woven into a 'story of shared love in union with God' (375), into a wholly fulfilled love. People will remember their life histories, seen clearly in heaven, without pain because of being woven into a story of shared love.

Stump includes a role for vicarious satisfaction. But this is 'not a present made to God to enable God to pardon sinners . . . It is rather an offer of union in love to each human sufferer of the depredations of others (369).' Stump comments on John Newton, the repentant slave trader:

For a wrongdoer such as Newton who is united to Christ and allies himself in his own repentance and satisfaction with the work of Christ, Christ's passion and death can serve as vicarious satisfaction which makes up what was still lacking in the satisfaction for his evil that Newton himself made. (369-370)

This extends the atonement to covering the sufferings caused to others: the satisfaction, the offer of loving union, is offered by Christ to them, not to God.

Stump notes that Anselmian accounts do not deal with shame, as distinct from guilt. She writes very interestingly on shame, the main point being that true honor defeats shame. 'True honor . . . results from a person's allying his truest or deepest self with the God who joins himself on the cross to every post-Fall person and shares all that is in that person's psyche, including the shame' (361). 'For a person to be in this union is for her to be someone for whom God has a desire. In virtue of being desired by the most powerful and most good being possible, she is desirable by the ultimate of standards . . . By this standard, all shame is defeated and falls away' (362).

Even so, Anselmian accounts (and indeed the Patristic approach mentioned earlier) could draw on a modified form of these ideas, given they will include some notion of God sending his Spirit to unite people to Christ, through his Spirit entering them. Being 'in Christ' would be different than Stump's account, but options seem available such as being a 'member' of Christ's body. What matters is that the desire of God for us is what defeats shame, and that God desires the deepest possible relationship with us.

Stump is emphatic that knowledge of Christ is not necessary for salvation. Many never know about Christ. Surrender to God's love or God's presence in some form is critical. Christ established atonement on behalf of all because all human psyches were in Christ on the cross. This has eternal implications: 'the openness of God to all human beings is . . . not bound by time. For mutual indwelling, then, all that is needed from any human being is the cessation of resistance to God's love' (369).

Stump's account (which she calls 'the Marian interpretation'), is highly original and complex. I have only given a sketch of it. There is much I cannot engage with, including her discussion of the Eucharist and suffering. Theological issues regarding distinct traditional Catholic and Protestant trajectories on justification, grace and perseverance, would need discussing in a fuller evaluation. Here I just mention some problems.

One problem is about moving towards quiescence. Stump suggests that hearing about the cross and Christ's work of atonement 'is the most promising way to help a human person . . . to the surrender to God's love that is the difficult necessary and sufficient condition for her salvation from her own inner broken state' (290). Setting aside any concern that Christ's suffering was merely the most promising way to help us, there is a problem about how Christ's story is of help in moving towards quiescence. This relates to a problem of how people escape from evil.

For Stump, God cannot act to efficaciously cause an interior movement in one to move one towards justification, until one reaches quiescence, when one's will has ceased resisting God. If God were to do this for anyone still resistant to God, this would be force them into submission. God would be inserting a first-order volition to turn towards God, in direct opposition to what their will desires. God would be replacing someone's will, undermining their nature, which God would not do.

Some people, though, seem particularly evil; Stump in fact gives a range of examples. How can such people ever move in the right direction? Indeed, this applies to anyone rejecting God. Think of people being on a scale from minus ten (maximal evil) to plus ten (moral perfection), with quiescence at zero. How could someone at minus eight, say, or indeed minus two, move up the scale?

Suffering, for Stump, can reduce resistance to God. Even so, any move up the negative scale is surely a move towards the good. But Stump affirms that God will not act to efficaciously cause anyone to move towards God until they are quiescent, where their wills are not resisting God's grace, but not accepting grace either. And there can be no movement in the direction of the good unless it is ultimately efficaciously caused by God interiorly acting within us. But how do evil people become less evil without moving towards the good? And how can the story of Christ's life and death be of help on that journey if it requires illumination to find it genuinely appealing? Or is hearing about the gospel of no help until the point of quiescence?

Similarly, how can someone be quiescent without already feeling some attraction towards Christ (or God) and without having got some knowledge of the evidence for Christ (or God) and the gospel? But the latter is (from a Christian viewpoint) truth, and any illumination about truth must always have God, the source of all truth, as its ultimate cause. And beginning to be genuinely attracted to Christ is not possible without God being the ultimate source of that. God must have caused such interior states prior to quiescence.

Significantly, and related to this issue of illumination, Stump does not discuss the topic of conscience. But conscience is surely central to atonement. Evil is linked to a darkened conscience. How can people move towards quiescence without an increase of light in their conscience? But does not all light in anyone's conscience ultimately come from God? Is not God then efficaciously causing an interior state which such a person does not desire?

Regarding grace, which elements are a person consciously aware of, and which not? Quiescence is where the will is neither detesting its past wrongdoing and loving God's goodness, nor cleaving to its past wrongdoing, and rejecting God's goodness, but is neutral between these states. This, for Stump, is the same state as being inactive about God's grace, neither accepting it, nor resisting it. But is grace an interior movement that one is (at least partly) aware of? If so, then it is likely to be expressed in terms of growing light, and the attractiveness of Christ being increasingly shown to one. This leads to the problems mentioned above. If, however, grace relates to an interior movement that one is not conscious of, then how can one be consciously resisting it? The only alternative seems to be that it is an interior movement one is not aware of, which one resists unconsciously. But then how is one aware of facing a major decision about whether to repent or not?

Stump's account of the cry of dereliction also seems problematic. Aside from one ideally wanting a clearer account of the transfer of the stain of sin, is it really possible for Christ, in his human nature, with one soul, or one psyche, with one human mind, to take into himself the psyches of all human beings over all time and space? That Christ has, in Stump's terminology, a divine mind, does not help, for the capacity of the human mind is what matters. Is Christ's psyche 'consubstantial' with the psyche of pre-fall Adam, so to speak? Or has his human nature been changed? Traditional Christian doctrine on incarnation, which Stump accepts, does not allow for such a change.

More could be said, especially on Stump's appeals to Scripture. She does interestingly discuss biblical sacrifice. For Stump, Christ's sacrifice 'is a matter of helping human beings to come to God' (399); a major aim was to disarm people's resistance to God. What, though, of scriptural indications that Christ's sacrifice is logically prior, as regards the new covenant, to divine forgiveness (e.g., Jeremiah 31:31-34; 2 Corinthians 5:19; Hebrews 9:1-10:22, especially 9:22)? Was not Christ's blood poured out for the forgiveness of sins (Matthew 26:28)? On Stump's account, what is the new covenant? Were there no legal benefits that Christ died for? And can 'slaves to sin' (Romans 6:17) even cease resisting God?

And is not faith, rather than 'quiescence', the surrender, scripturally speaking, which God seeks (e.g., Acts 16:31; Romans 5:1-2)? Does not faith involve the decisive step of surrendering self-control through turning to God? But if God commands faith, then 'quiescence' still involves resistance to trusting God.

These are important matters regarding access to God's kingdom. For Stump, God forgives everyone, repentant or not, because God loves everyone, and failure to forgive involves failing to desire their good and union with them. But even under Stump's account, kingdom access is not granted unconditionally. There is an issue of love here, though, which Stump does not cover: God's love for his kingdom, which God surely desires to protect. Why grant access to those who would defile the kingdom, bring harm and break its law? This love needs consideration; it clearly relates to atonement and forgiveness.

A full Christian account of love would also cover the most important love: God's love of his own triune life, goodness, and perfections. Related to this are the topics of worship and holiness. Starting, as Stump does, from an account of love which does not include these, is problematic. Worship involves adoring God, acknowledging God's holiness, majesty and glorious perfections. Such adoration is a form of love, presumably the highest for creatures. Atonement surely relates to overcoming our rejection of worship.

Finally, another feature of love not covered by Stump is listening. The Son of God is the 'Word' of God. We are loving God when we wait on, and listen to, God. The fall involved a failure to listen and trust. Scripture emphasizes listening. Hence the concern above about adequately hearing God's 'voice' in Scripture. But these are complex matters, and we all fall short. Whilst unpersuaded by Stump's proposal, I think her material on personal presence of real interest, and her work on shame strikingly insightful. Theologians who have reservations about the tradition of analytic philosophy may continue to harbour doubts. That aside, this book is a very significant project within the tradition of analytic philosophical theology, and one in which integrity and humanity shine through.