Attention is Cognitive Unison: An Essay in Philosophical Psychology

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Christopher Mole, Attention is Cognitive Unison: An Essay in Philosophical Psychology, Oxford University Press, 2011, 186pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195384529.

Reviewed by Sebastian Watzl, Harvard University


Christopher Mole's book is the first philosophical monograph on the nature of attention in more than 40 years. Already for this braveness it should be celebrated. Its appearance marks a renewed interest in the topic of attention by philosophers.[1] In retrospect, it is surprising that philosophers have neglected attention while working on a variety of other phenomena with which it seems closely connected, ranging from belief, memory, and consciousness to intentional action. Mole's book offers an extended and engaging argument for why it is a mistake to leave the topic of attention to psychologists and neuroscientists alone. A fundamental metaphysical issue concerning the kind of thing attention is needs to be addressed in order to arrive at a unified theory. Mole's book does an excellent job in drawing interest to the philosophical puzzles about attention and offers a new and distinctive perspective. I am not -- in the end -- convinced that the metaphysical re-orientation Mole argues for is really needed. But I have learned a lot from engaging with Mole's argumentation: it has helped me to think more clearly about attention both at those points where I agree with Mole and at those where our opinions diverge.

Mole's short book is divided into seven chapters. In chapter 1, Mole starts with the history of the study of attention. His discussion here is fascinating and well focused. It brings out a question about attention that puts the contemporary debate into a wider context. Standard cognitive psychology, Mole suggests, has followed William James in his view that attention consists in a set of cognitive, neuronal, or embodied processes. Yet, Mole argues, James' view was not without opponents. F.H. Bradley, in particular, called into doubt the very viability of a process-centered metaphysics for attention. Mole believes that Bradley was onto something. Yet an alternative to the standard conception has not yet been developed in detail.

Mole's goal in Chapters 2-4, then, is to reconsider the type of metaphysics appropriate for attention. Chapter 2 articulates a distinction between what he calls process-first phenomena and adverbial phenomena. The distinction, roughly, is between processes and the manner in which something is going on. Combustion, for example, is the process of burning, while haste is a manner of doing something. Chapter 3, then, argues that according to this distinction attention should be seen as an adverbial phenomenon, in contrast to the standard assumption that treats it as a process-first phenomenon. The fundamental notion of attention, according to the adverbial view, is of such-and-such happening attentively. Chapter 4 spells out Mole's account of the relevant adverbial phenomenon. This is the cognitive unison approach. What happen attentively, for Mole, are tasks: roughly things the subject is doing. Attention therefore implies agency. According to Mole's account, a task is performed attentively just in case the cognitive resources the agent could bring to bear in the performance of that task are not occupied with something that does not in fact serve it. Attentiveness therefore gets characterized negatively: it consists in the absence of irrelevant (but potentially useful) cognitive processing. Since these three chapters form the heart of the book, I will focus on them in my discussion below.

Before I get there, here is what comes in the rest of the book. Chapter 5 answers an important objection to Mole's view, namely that it can't account for the causal explanations in which attention figures. Overall I found Mole's discussion here helpful. Our notion of causation seems to have enough flexibility to allow for a causal role of attentiveness. Chapter 6 articulates the consequences of the cognitive unison approach for the science of attention. Mole here offers a rather deflationary outlook on much scientific research. His tone seemed to me more skeptical than necessary. Arguably, Mole could even have supported the cognitive unison approach based on an inference to the best explanation from the scientific work he refers to (e.g., Alan Allport (pp. 120f) and the biased competition tradition (pp. 138ff)). Chapter 7, finally, considers the significance of attention for solving philosophical puzzles about mental content and consciousness. Mole here again is rather skeptical about whether attention can do much work in either area. I will say more about these philosophical issues below.

I believe that Mole's book contains an important insight. The insight is that the nature of attention cannot be captured in terms of functionally or neuronally localized processes: attention is not a specific and circumscribed set of neuronal or computational mechanisms in the brain. In broad strokes I also agree with the methodology Mole uses to argue for that insight, combining considerations based on our ordinary discourse about and experience of attention with considerations based on empirical findings in psychology and the neurosciences. Such a two-pronged approach is appropriate for attention, as it is for perception, volition, or desire.[2] I share Mole's view that in the case of attention this approach speaks against many reductivist accounts, and (more controversially) for a view on which all attention implies agency. Finally, I tend to agree with much of the spirit of the cognitive unison view that attention has less to do with specific operations than with whether and how the parts work together. It is a holistic phenomenon in which information processing gets integrated and organized. In this way considerations about attention might indeed force us to give up an assumption in cognitive psychology, i.e., that we can understand all of cognition by breaking it up into simpler mechanisms.

I am less convinced, though, that the fundamental insight just sketched is best articulated in terms of the adverbial approach Mole favors.

Let me look a little closer at the distinction between process-first phenomena and adverbial phenomena (I'll speak of P-phenomena and A-phenomena). According to Mole, noun phrases referring to P-phenomena classify events by appeal to the processes these events instantiate. As examples of P-phenomena Mole cites combustion, decay, digestion and evolution (p. 29). Talk of combustion, for example, classifies events together because they all instantiate the processes involved in burning. Noun-phrases referring to A-phenomena, by contrast, classify together events that happen in the same manner (whether or not they instantiate the same processes), just as we may classify objects that have the same function whether or not they are made of the same material (pp. 26ff). Examples of A-phenomena are haste, stealth, style and employment (p. 29). A-phenomena according to Mole are not just disjunctive or multiply realizable (pp. 30-32): in order to have an instance of a multiply realizable (or disjunctive) phenomenon (like jade) it is enough to have an instance of at least one realizer (like jadeite). By contrast, the very same processes that completely constitute a certain adverbial phenomenon in one instance need not constitute that phenomenon in a different context.

There certainly is an intuition that haste and style are not processes while combustion and decay are.[3] But intuitively this is because the latter have a reductive explanation, while the former do not. Once we consider high-level phenomena without (easy) reductive explanation the process/manner distinction seems to lose its intuitive grip. Consider walking: is this a manner in which a locomotion event is happening? Or is this a type of locomotion process? Or consider deductive reasoning: is this a manner of thinking or cognizing? Or is it a type of mental process or activity? We need a theoretical account of the process/manner distinction that would help us to decide such cases.

Yet when Mole tells us what "instantiating the same process" and "happening in the same manner" come to (p. 28), his discussion is confined to more or less two paragraphs: a classification is by process if it classifies by objects gaining or losing some property; it classifies by manner if it classifies by events gaining or losing some property.

Even putting general metaphysical worries about the object/event distinction aside, I was puzzled by this distinction. First, why speak of gaining and losing properties? Even for Mole's own account it is unclear which properties are gained or lost in attentive events. Attentive events seem to share the possession of the unison property. Second, even in the case of processes (where talk of gaining and losing properties seems more adequate) it is unclear how that description fits cognitive processes, e.g., if understood as computations among representational states and events. Which objectshere gain or lose properties?[4] Third, Mole's explication did not actually help me to get a grip on the problematic cases. Just consider walking: an object is gaining a property here (the walker changes location), but a motion event is also gaining a property (the motion is constantly changing). Maybe Mole would propose to treat these on a case by case basis, but I found it hard to see which considerations would bear either way.

I was also worried that sometimes a manner of doing something cannot be distinguished from a type of process. Especially: couldn't something be a P-phenomenon on one level of explanation and an A-phenomenon on a different one? For example, couldn't a subject having, gaining, or losing some property or engaging in some activity (all of which would be processes, I take it) be realized by the manner in which certain events (in her or her brain) are happening?

All of this matters directly for the case of attention. Consider the following non-reductive views of attention, where a subject attends to something roughly if:

(1)  she selects an item for action so as to solve the Many-Many problem (see Wu 2011 for explication), or

(2)  she structures her field of consciousness so that some experiences are more central than others (see Watzl 2011).[5]

(1) and (2) describe processes. But it seems possible that (1) and (2) are going on just in case, for example, neural or computational processing is happening in a certain manner. Subpersonal adverbialism, as we might call it, seems compatible with a personal level process theory of attention.

Let me continue with Mole's argument against the process-first view. For a counterexample against the view we need a set of processes that completely constitute an attention event on one occasion but do not constitute an attention event on a different occasion (pp. 33-36). Mole cites feature binding as the central counterexample (pp. 36ff). In some cases feature binding constitutes attention, Mole suggests, but in other cases (e.g., in hemi-neglect) it does not.

Yet, there is a rather obvious reply to this type of argument, namely that the processes under discussion do not completely constitute an attention event. Maybe feature binding processes, for example, are only closely associated with, or an important part or aspect of those processes that constitute attention. Finding a case of feature binding without attention seems to suggest first and foremost that attention is not feature binding but a somewhat different process. The process theory needs to be refined.

Mole addresses this kind of worry. He argues that repeated appeal to this form of reply would make the attention constituting processes overly complex, which threatens (a) to trivialize the process-first view, and (b) to be incompatible with the apparent fact that in certain contexts attention can be a fairly simple phenomenon (p. 40).

It is true that certain types of refinement would trivialize the view, namely appeal to a disjunction of processes described in overly specific (and maybe time- and experiment-indexed) terms. But there are other options. Consider a theory that identifies attention with a personal level process as in (1) and (2) above. Arguably, according to such theories no specific lower level process by itself ever constitutes an attention event. A low level process at best partially constitutes the high level activity. Or consider fairly holistic sub-personal accounts of attention (as in the biased-competition tradition): any localized or specific sub-personal process would need to be integrated into that global process in the right way in order to have an attention event.

I would have liked Mole to say more about such responses. As far as I could see the availability of a non-reductive account of attention as a type of process threatens to undermine his overall argument against the process-first view.

Let me now turn to Mole's own account in Chapter 4. Mole favors not a subpersonal adverbialism of the kind mentioned above, but what might be called personal level adverbialism. His account is, as I said above, that an agent performs a task attentively just in case its performance displays cognitive unison, which happens if and only if the cognitive resources the agent could bring to bear in the performance of that task are not occupied with an activity that does not in fact serve it (paraphrasing the official formulation on p. 51).

This chapter contains a lot of fascinating material. In the course of it Mole provides a definition of 'task', 'cognitive process', and 'could bring to bear.' He has a very interesting discussion of how tasks stand in sub-ordination relations to each other, spells out reasons for preferring a negative (or "privative") characterization of attention, talks about various ways attention can and cannot be divided, ways in which attention might and might not come in degrees or be partial. Whether or not one agrees with the cognitive unison theory or adverbialism this chapter is a rich resource for anyone who likes to think seriously about attention.

I was not convinced, though, of the big picture that drives personal level adverbialism. For Mole what occurs attentively are "things that the subject is in the business of doing and that she is active with." (p. 52). I agree that it is very intuitive that what occurs attentively is something a subject does. Mole provides a rather strong characterization of what "doing" here amounts to, though. As I mentioned, Mole talks about tasks (p. 52). If something is to be your task, then you have to have "an understanding" of that task that guides your performance of it. Mole, unfortunately, does not say very much about what it is to be guided by one's understanding of a task. What he says is that such understanding "enables [the agent] to deal with alternatives" (p. 55) and that the range of alternatives she needs to be able to deal with "depends on one's form of life." (p. 56). This, to me, was rather unclear. What Mole seems to be after is a distinction between what an agent is doing and what is merely happening to her that is genuinely weaker than the notion of voluntary or intentional action (p. 53). I would have needed to hear more to decide whether Mole's appeal to guidance by understanding delivers a plausible way of explicating that distinction.

Whether or not this is the right explication, many readers will wonder how Mole's account deals with involuntary attention: cases of drifting attention, attentional capture, or involuntary mind-wandering.

Some might suggest that these phenomena call into doubt the general idea that when a subject is attending she is actively doing something (even in the weak, non-intentional sense hinted at above). I can see that type of doubt, but in the end I share with Mole the view that any case of attention implies a form of agency (yet, I think that it should be a condition of adequacy on the relevant notion of agency that it be exhibited even in daydreaming, mind-wandering, or drifting attention).

Nevertheless, I think that involuntary attention creates a problem for Mole's account at a fairly basic level. It calls into doubt personal level adverbialism. Let E be an event where your visual attention drifts to some more or less salient sound at your window (modifying one of Mole's examples, p. 53). We can then, I believe, construct the following argument:

(1)  All instances of attention events are instances of a subject's doing something attentively (personal level adverbialism)

(2)  E is an instance of an attention event.

(3)  E is not an instance of a subject's doing something attentively.


(4)  There are instances of attention events that are not instances of events where a subject does something attentively.


(5)  Personal level adverbialism is false.

Mole might respond by denying either (2) or (3).

Let me start with (3). Mole suggests that when your attention is involuntarily caught by the sudden sound, this might start and get integrated in an episode of looking to the window that is guided by your understanding of what you are doing (p. 53). You are then involuntarily doing something attentively. On the basis of this, he might suggest that E just is the beginning of attentive looking (or listening). Yet, this response is inadequate for the case I described. In my case you are genuinely distracted: your attention wanders. Your listening to the sound is not something you do attentively at all.

How about denying (2)? Mole would probably say that the cases at hand are just the opposite of attention: distraction, daydreaming, etc. (p. 57). If we were to classify daydreaming, for example, as a case of attention (though involuntary), we would lose our grip on what attention is by losing its opposite.

Yet, this response seems to rely on favoring one notion of attention at the expense of others (which is the type of charge Mole raises against many process theories). As I said earlier, ordinary talkabout attention includes talk about attention drifting and being caught. Introspection of our conscious experience seems to detect in these cases the same kind of highlighting of our experience of an object or event. Finally, much of what we know about the neuronal underpinnings of attention suggests important similarities between controlled and uncontrolled episodes of attention. For these three reasons, it seems to me that a unified theory of attention should not deny (2).

What about the idea that we should think of attention against a contrast class of inattention? I agree with Mole (pp. 157f) that a theory of attention has to account for the selectivity within our mental lives. Yet, arguably, selectivity is present in drifting attention or daydreaming (certain sounds or mental images are selected at the expense of, say, awareness of the subject's surroundings). The selectivity of attention is compatible with its being more or less focused or dispersed, and with a particular activity occupying more or less of your attention. These various ways in which attention can be graded and varied in complex ways seem both natural as well as backed up by much empirical work on attention. The goal of a unified theory of attention would seem to be to account for both selectivity as well as the various forms of gradation.

Overall, then, it seems to me that we can accept (with the cognitive unison account) that your listening to the sound was inattentive without denying that much of your attention was directed at that sound. The cognitive unison approach might give us an account of attentively doing something,[6] without being a complete account of attention. For this reason I remain skeptical of personal level adverbialism, as well as -- as I said above -- remaining unconvinced of Mole's argument against some of the process theories of attention I favor. In a nutshell: I believe that Mole's insight concerning the holistic and non-local character of attention is best captured not in terms of his adverbialist account but in terms of a better process theory. In order to make the case for such a better theory of attention, though, we need to look at more data than Mole has given us.

Even though I was not completely convinced of Mole's adverbialism, I was curious about what impact it and the cognitive unison account might have in philosophy, specifically on the debates about attention and reference, and attention and consciousness that Mole discusses in Chapter 7. John Campbell's work on attention and reference returned attention to the agenda of analytic philosophy, yet in some parts that work seemed to rely on a too-quick alignment of attention and feature binding. And while the debate about the connections between attention and consciousness has been heated and fruitful it could benefit from a clearer conception of what attention actually is. In both areas, then, there seems to be room for plenty of philosophical work for a fresh outlook on the nature of attention.

Mole does have a distinctive view in both areas: attention can't do the philosophical work people thought it can do (p. 136). For the most part, though, the cognitive unison approach does not play much role in his argumentation.

In the case of mental content Mole's skepticism arises from the view that in order to explain how it is that the subject attends to some particular thing (rather than, say, its properties) we need toappeal to the idea that she is thinking about that thing (pp. 143ff). But if that is so, we cannot (on account of circularity) appeal to attention in order to explain how thought about something and thus representational content are possible. Mole's argument here was independent of his view about the nature of attention, yet he suggests (pp. 154ff) that the cognitive unison theory implies the conclusion.

I was not really convinced by either his argument nor quite of the claim about the implication. On a view like Campbell's, conscious attention to a particular object does not imply being in a state (like a thought) that represents that particular. Instead, the subject bears a more primitive acquaintance relation to that object. Furthermore, it seems to me that a variant of the cognitive unison theory could use the same strategy: certain forms of attention might be adverbial modifications not "of contentful thought" (p. 155) but of more primitive activities so that these are acquaintance inducing. In reply, Mole would ask how it could be that the subject bears the acquaintance relation to some object rather than some other one. This is a real worry, but it is also a worry that the kind of direct realism about conscious experience Campbell favors is designed to answer. I did not understand how Mole's argument engages this type of response.

In the case of consciousness, Mole argues that attention cannot explain how it is that certain mental states are conscious, because there are inattentive conscious states (pp. 156f). Mole discusses recent objections to this pre-theoretic idea coming from the study of inattentional blindness, and finds them wanting (pp. 159-162).

It is certainly true that you can, for example, be conscious of a sound without attentively listening to that sound, and I completely agree with Mole that nothing in the recent empirical literature shows that this is false. But the most plausible version of the view that attention is necessary for consciousness need not deny the pre-theoretic idea. Instead, it would suggest that in order to be conscious of that sound, you must still pay some degree of attention to it. It seems to me that Mole's version of the cognitive unison account does not allow for this type of degree of attention (though see pp. 83ff). We here see, I believe, how this limits the applicability of Mole's view. [7]

Let me end by returning to the start of Mole's book. Mole begins his preface with the fact that there is no ongoing philosophical conversation to which his book contributes. I believe that Mole's book (and his dissertation from which it springs) will in some years be seen as having helped to start a new philosophical conversation. Those interested in this new conversation about attention will have to engage with Mole's book. Even if one is not convinced by some of Mole's argumentation, this is an important philosophical achievement.


Block, N. (2010). Attention and Mental Paint. Philosophical Issues 20 (1):23-63.

Burge, T. (2010). Origins of Objectivity. Oxford University Press.

Holton, R. (2009). Willing, Wanting, Waiting. Oxford University Press.

Mole, C. (2008). Attention and Consciousness. Journal of Consciousness Studies 15 (4):86-104.

Mole, C., Smithies, D., and Wu, W. (2011). Attention: Philosophical and Psychological Essays. Oxford University Press.

Schroeder, T. (2004). Three Faces of Desire. Oxford University Press.

Watzl, S. (2011). Attention as Structuring of the Stream of Consciousness. In: Mole, Smithies and Wu (eds.), Attention: Philosophical and Psychological Essays. Oxford University Press.

Wu, W. (2011). Attention as Selection for Action. In: Mole, Smithies and Wu (eds.), Attention: Philosophical and Psychological Essays. Oxford University Press.

[1] See also the collection Mole co-edited: Mole, Smithies and Wu (2011) or Block (2010) (as well as several other articles in the last few years).

[2] See Holton (2009), Burge (2010) and Schroeder (2004) respectively.

[3] I am less sure about employment. Arguably, employment is a type of social process. Google, in fact, returns more than 1 million results on "the employment process." (though many of them describe specific instances of employment processes at specific institutions or companies and so the linguistic data don't need to bear directly on Mole's point here).

[4] Thanks to Carrie Figdor who in conversation brought this issue to my attention.

[5] Though the view described there concerns only the nature of conscious attention, the general point still applies.

[6] Though I should say that I prefer the positive account of unison where you need enough unison to have a case of attentively doing something instead of the privative characterization Mole favors (see Mole's discussion on pp. 70-72). Unfortunately, for lack of space I am not able to get into this discussion here.

[7] Mole argues further that adverbialism is not committed to the claim that all attention is conscious, and that group attention provides at least one counterexample to the claim that attention is sufficient for consciousness (I couldn't quite figure out to what extent Mole here withdraws a view he argued for in his Mole 2008).