Attention, Not Self

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Jonardon Ganeri, Attention, Not Self, Oxford University Press, 2017, 392pp., $40.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198757405.

Reviewed by Sebastian Watzl, University of Oslo


Why should we study the philosophical ideas of someone who lived many centuries ago, in a far-away part of the world, and in a highly different cultural context? One reason is to expand one's philosophical horizon: to move beyond the narrow confinements of one's own little neighborhood of the vast philosophical city (Priest 2011), and thus to approach the contemporary philosophical scene with newly gained humility on account of its limitations.

One educated in contemporary cognitive science and philosophy may have expected in Jonardon Ganeri's book a confrontation with such a marvelously strange new neighborhood. It is, after all, a book largely on the philosophical ideas of the 6th century Indian philosopher Buddhaghosa, writing in the Pāli language in the Theravāda Buddhist tradition. As read by Ganeri, Buddhaghosa's account of the mind, by contrast, is often strikingly familiar. Buddhaghosa comes across as stunningly modern, with a picture of the mind that meshes closely with the latest empirical studies in cognitive science and the latest discussions in the philosophy of mind. Ganeri's book thus practices the "philosophy without borders" he advocates in the book's postscript: it aims "to discover a fundamental theory true of the human mind as such" by considering "theories from a plurality of cultural locations." (341)

Ganeri provides a substantial and novel account of the human mind by drawing on the "rich theoretical vocabulary" in the Pāli tradition, that is then "transformed . . . with the assistance of tools, techniques, and empirical findings from the cognitive sciences." (347) The book is both an independent theory of the mind and an interpretation and textual analysis of Buddhaghosa's writings. While some parts of Ganeri's book mostly show that Buddhaghosa's view fits the picture we get from cognitive science, the last part links some of that detailed investigation of mental processes in novel ways to broader questions about what it means to be human. The resulting picture is rich and interesting, and Ganeri's writing is fluent and engaging.

Less clear are the conditions for the success for Ganeri's transformative exercise: for someone looking mostly for the "fundamental theory true of the human mind", it can sometimes not be entirely obvious what is gained by the detailed engagement with Buddhaghosa's writings. One would have liked to see a bit more of where Buddhaghosa challenges contemporary cognitive science, than where his thoughts mesh with it. And for a scholar of the Theravāda tradition, Ganeri's book may feel too independent in its pursuit of his own aspirations rather than scholarly precision. I personally would have liked to get to know a bit more of the weird architecture, the odd places and unusual routes of Buddhaghosa's neighborhood before it gets transformed into something quite so familiar. But arguably this curiosity was roused only after seeing -- with the help of Ganeri's book -- that neighborhood through a lens of my own.

The background for Ganeri's (and Buddhaghosa's) philosophy of mind is a rejection of what Ganeri calls the "Authorship View", according to which agents are "compositionally irreducible substances" (16) and the fundamental causes of intentional action. As Ganeri argues in detail in the last parts of the book, this rejection does not mean that Theravāda Buddhism rejects the concept of a person and its boundaries. Rather, the rejection of the Authorship View consists in a metaphysical and methodological principle: a theory of mindedness should not appeal to subjects or agents in an explanatorily substantial or irreducible way. In a suggestive image, Buddhaghosa compares the human to a mechanical doll (dāru-yanta) that "walks and stands merely through the combination of strings and wood" (19, Ganeri's citation and translation of Buddhaghosa's Path 594 XVIII.31).

Part of what is so modern in Ganeri's reading of Buddhaghosa is just this commitment to a mechanistic conception of the human mind, a conception indeed shared by mainstream modern cognitive psychology. "A human being", Ganeri aptly puts it in a contemporary image, "is like a self-driving vehicle whose various complex perceptual, motor and planning systems enable it to navigate its environment." (19) It is arguably the common methodological commitment to explanations in terms of processes and mechanisms that makes room for the close mesh between cognitive science and Buddhaghosa's texts that Ganeri suggests.

Buddhaghosa's account of the mind is provided at two levels. Ganeri calls the first level the "Philosophy of Consciousness." The second is the "Philosophy of Cognition." (62.) The distinction between these two levels is explained in Chapters 2 and 3, and then Chapters 4-6 (Part II) investigate the first level, while Chapters 7-10 (Part III) are concerned with the second. The distinction between these two levels, in my view, is one of the most original contributions of Ganeri's book to contemporary philosophy of mind and cognitive science.

At the level of the philosophy of consciousness, mindedness or intentionality[1] is analyzed by an investigation of the structure of the citta-cetasika complex, of citta (mind, directedness) and its concomitants (cetasikas). Ganeri compares the concomitants to the fingers on a hand, and citta to the palm (40): mind's grasp of its objects (intentional directedness) consists in their combined activity. The complex is an "emergent dynamical system" (37), where the concomitants are the various "functional aspects of conscious mindedness" (38) rather than parts of a reductive explanation of intentionality (23).

The level of philosophy of cognition, on the other hand, investigates the path (vīthi) to consciousness (58), "the causal conditions under which consciousness arises" (42). Externally directed intentionality is the result of a complex causal process that consists in the operation of four "modules of the mind" (43).

What exactly is the distinction between Ganeri's two levels of analysis? Daniel Dennett (1969) has distinguished between a personal and a sub-personal level of explanation. At first sight, a contemporary reader may have expected Ganeri's two levels to align with this distinction. But, as Ganeri argues (60), this would give the subject or agent an explanatory importance that it cannot carry -- according to Buddhaghosa's methodological commitments explained above.  Ganeri suggests that instead we should think about it as a distinction between "an analysis of the structure of intentional and attentive conscious states" and an explanation of "what makes a mental state intentional . . . in terms of the processes that underpin its emergence" (61).

I believe that Ganeri (and Buddhaghosa) here indeed point toward an important distinction. I suggest drawing it as follows. First, we have an account of the essence or nature of intentional states and activities. The philosophy of consciousness thus provides an account of what it is to be an intentional state or activity. Second, we have a constitutive explanation of these intentional states and activities. This is the subject of the philosophy of cognition. Constitutive explanations here are ones that "consists of an exhibition of the internal causal structure of the explanandum" (Salmon 1984, 270). They are to be contrasted with etiological explanations that would take intentional states as the end-product of the path to consciousness (Buddhaghosa holds that the modules of the mind operate simultaneously (203)).

The distinction between essence and constitutive explanation, in my view, is more fundamental than the personal/sub-personal distinction: it is prior to a philosophical dispute about whether or not intentional or conscious states are essentially the states of a subject or agent.

Ganeri calls his (and Buddhaghosa's) view of the mind Attentionalism, which is "the stance which lends attention centrality in explanatory projects in philosophy." (5) Attention thus clearly is one of the most central components in Ganeri's picture on both of the levels just mentioned. Attentional placing (ekaggatā) and attentional focusing (manasikāra) are central aspects of the structure of intentional states. Attentional orienting (āvajjana) and late attentional gate-keeping or attentional 'ordering' (anuloma, a component of javana, which is identified with working memory) are important components of their constitutive explanation.

In Parts IV and V Ganeri further expands on the explanatory role of attention: intention (cetanā), introspection, and mindfulness (sati) (Chapter 11), as well as episodic memory (Chapter 12) are all forms of attention. Further, we know about the mental states of others through a kind of attention that is related to, but distinct from, perceptual attention (Chapter 13). And we are invited to think of the 'core self' in terms of "those aspects of the structure of the stream of consciousness which dynamically take centre stage when there is attention." (331) Finally, both what matters in survival and what matters about the way we face death (334-339) centrally involve forms of attention (Chapter 16). Overall, as Ganeri sums up his project, the notion of attention is of fundamental and central explanatory importance "in the philosophy of mind, in epistemology, in action theory, and in ethics." (339-340) Ganeri thus accepts the Explanatory Centrality of attention.

What then is attention according to Ganeri (or Buddhaghosa)? Interestingly, Ganeri also holds that "attention . . . is disunified: it is not a single psychological kind." (25) He here agrees with a widespread "consensus" (Carrasco 2011, 1517) in the field of contemporary psychology "that attention is not a unitary construct" (ibid.; cf. citation by Ganeri, p. 221). And indeed, while Ganeri uses the English word 'attention' expansively throughout the book, he explicitly acknowledges that there is no single word for attention in the Pāli or Sanskrit texts he discusses (31). Ganeri thus also believes in the Disunity of attention: attention is not a single thing.

There is a puzzle about how both Explanatory Centrality and Disunity can be true. I will first raise the puzzle, and then suggest several routes for resolving it.

Here is the puzzle. Suppose one starts with Disunity. If attention is not a single thing, then nothing would seem to be lost if we stopped using the term (thus, in English, speaking a bit more like Buddhaghosa in his Pāli). But if we could just stop using a term without any loss, then it seems that the term cannot refer to anything of central explanatory importance. It is, after all, dispensable. Another way of raising the worry: one way of taking Disunity is to think of attention as a merely disjunctive kind: something is the referent of 'attention' just in case it is either ekaggatā or manasikāra or āvajjana or anuloma or cetanā or sati. Nothing is added by saying that these are forms of attention. If this worry were to bite, then Ganeri's whole book would have been better written without ever mentioning the term 'attention' (which, of course, may then have required a different title).

Ganeri arguably is not alone in his joint acceptance of Explanatory Centrality and Disunity. Many people in contemporary cognitive science, as Ganeri rightly observes, think similarly. Is there a way to escape the problem just raised? The task is to show how something can be a disunified, but not disjunctive; a kind that both lacks unity but also can play central explanatory roles.

The members of merely disjunctive kinds are related in only trivial and un-interesting ways. Ganeri clearly rejects this. Attention generally, he says, is an "ongoing structuring of experience and action." (12) But there are many different such organizational phenomena and thus many different kinds of attention (31). To say that attentional phenomena are all instances of such an ongoing structuring of experience and action is, I take it, meant to interestingly relate those phenomena. Since attentional phenomena are ongoing, static forms of organization (like a certain organization of memory or knowledge) are, for example, excluded; all attentional phenomena presumably also must be (mental) processes (attention thus couldn't be a substance-like resource); and to speak of attentional phenomena as ways of 'structuring' or 'organizing' is probably meant to exclude content-specific phenomena such as perceiving some specific item, or thinking about something in a certain way.

Another indication that Ganeri thinks that attention is not a merely disjunctive kind is that he thinks that one can discover new forms of attention: Buddhaghosa has discovered, according to Ganeri, an important distinction between placing and focusing, and he has discovered that we know about the minds of others through a form of attention. If attention were a merely disjunctive kind then there could be no such discoveries: the extension of the concept of attention would be fixed by the disjunction that defines it. A merely disjunctive approach to the disunity of attention thus would not explain a certain Open-endedness in the concept of attention that is evidenced in the discovery of novel forms of attention (or distinctions among them).

What, then, is the relationship between the 'varieties of attention' and the 'generic' (224) notion of attention characterized "at a very high level of abstraction" (224)? Let us consider some options for how to make sense of Explanatory Centrality, Disunity, and Open-endedness together. Before I get to three promising options for how to think of that relationship, let me mention two that I think are unhelpful.

On the one hand, one might think that the varieties of attention just are related by similarity or resemblance. But similarity is too easy to get: anything resembles anything else -- in some respect. If attention is to play 'central explanatory roles' then the varieties of attention must resemble each other in some interesting way. A resemblance view by itself thus can't explain Explanatory Centrality. On the other hand, one might think that attention is multiply realized in the varieties of attention. But a multiply realized state or process is often more explanatory than its realizers, e.g. by figuring more centrally in law-like generalizations. But then attention would not be disunified. Multiple realization thus by itself can't explain Disunity.

Here then are three more promising routes. A first option is that the relationship is the one between determination and determinable. Ganeri sometimes speaks of the relationship in this way (241). Attention would thus stand to ekaggatā or manasikāra like red stands to scarlet or crimson. On this view, there would be a sense in which attention is not a single thing: the ongoing structuring of experience and action would not be a specific, determinate process, but a determinable process that has many different determinations. Each of the (more) determinate processes would arguably have richer causal explanatory roles than the determinable process (the causal powers of a determinable are often thought to be a proper subset of its determinates; cf. Wilson 2017). At the same time, the kinds of attention would have something interesting in common, since it is widely thought that determinables have a non-disjunctive specification; we could discover novel determinates of the determinable or distinctions between determinates that had been previously overlooked; and, indeed, one can gain explanatory power in the form of unification by recognizing the determinates to be determinates of the same determinable (drawing on Kitcher 1981; see also Wilson 2017).

One advantage of pursuing the determination-determinable view is that the metaphysical framework is fairly well developed, and that we therefore get fairly clear constraints on its adequacy. But it doesn't seem to be a perfect fit for Ganeri's picture: it is, for example, often held that the determinates of a determinable at the same level of determination must be incompatible (no red object can be both crimson and scarlet all over; cf. Wilson 2017 on 'Determinate Incompatibility'). But the attentional processes described by Ganeri in the philosophy of consciousness and those described in the philosophy of cognition do not seem to be incompatible. But they also do not seem to be determinates of each other.

A second option is to think of the notion of attention as a family resemblance concept in the sense derived from Wittgenstein's philosophical investigations. Wittgenstein's most famous example is the concept of a game. There is no single set of necessary and sufficient conditions for something to fall under the concept of a game. Games form a cluster in a multi-dimensional feature space, but there is no essence they all share. The family resemblance view clearly accounts for disunity: attention does not have an essence or nature (cf. 222) or an associated set of necessary and sufficient conditions. It can also explain why the varieties of attention are more fundamental than attention itself.

Can the family resemblance view account for explanatory centrality? Probably only partially: it can be explanatory to find that the members of the attention cluster play central explanatory roles, rather than, say, the subject or self, or the members of a different cluster of mental states or processes. But the family resemblance view arguably inherits some of the problems of the resemblance view: by picking different similarity or resemblance metrics we are going to find different similarity clusters. The 'attention' family arguably would not be objectively related, but only related relative to a theorist's (like Ganeri's) choice of which similarities between various phenomena to highlight.

A third option is to think of attention as an 'analogous' process, using a concept of analogy that was popular among medieval philosophers (Ashworth 2017; see also Shields 2002 on the closely related Aristotelian concept of homonymy). In a contemporary revival of that tradition, Kris McDaniel (2010) mentions the influential example of being healthy:

I am healthy, my circulatory system is healthy, and broccoli is healthy . . . each of the 'specifications' of being healthy are more natural than the 'generic' feature . . . But being healthy is not a mere disjunction: the various specifications of being healthy are related in such a way to ensure some kind of unity . . . the features . . . are unified by analogy. 

Attentional phenomena might be similarly unified by analogy. If they are, then each of the specific phenomena would be more fundamental or explanatory than the 'generic' or analogous phenomenon (attention), and yet the analogous phenomenon would still be more fundamental or explanatory than the mere disjunction of the phenomena related by analogy. As the medievals discussed, there are different relationships of analogy. Some are asymmetric, distinguishing a prior from a posterior sense of the relevant term.[2] Maybe the prior sense of 'healthy' is the notion of a healthy organism: an organism's subsystems or food are healthy insofar as they contribute to the health of the organism. Other notions are symmetric, giving no priority to one of the items related by analogy. Both the symmetric and the asymmetric notions could be applied to attention. Maybe there is one focal or central variety of attention, and all the other varieties are forms of attention because they bear an important structural relation to that focal variety. Or maybe there is no one focal variety, and instead the varieties of attention are equally fundamental, and yet more fundamental or explanatory than the analogous process of attention. The analogy view thus accepts Disunity, since attention does not have a single essence. The view also accepts Explanatory Centrality, since it accepts that each variety is highly explanatory, and that the analogous attention itself is still much more explanatory than the mere disjunction of its varieties (because their structural relations, for example, are very important). And the view accepts Open-endedness, since we may discover a novel variety by discovering a novel and interesting relationship to the other varieties.

A version of the analogy view may be the best option for Ganeri, and everyone else who accepts both the explanatory centrality, the disunity, and the open-endedness of attention. It is a better fit than the determinate-determinable view, and takes disunity more seriously. And it is better suited than the family resemblance view to give attention a central explanatory role. At the same time, the structure of the (variants of the) analogy view arguably is itself not yet very well understood (as McDaniel (2010), for example, admits). I think of this as an invitation to practice more of Ganeri's philosophy without borders: real theoretical progress in our account of the mind may require taking note of a 6th century Indian's detailed observation of the variety of processes that structure the mind, contemporary cognitive science's findings regarding the details of their operation, an Aristotelian metaphysics in its interpretation by the Islamic Ibn Sīnā, and some of the tools of the analytic philosophy originating in early 20th century Europe and developed in Australia and North-America. Whether or not Ganeri has brought us closer to a fundamental theory of the human, the philosophy of mind is indeed a rich field for such "meaningful intellectual encounter" (347) across temporal and spatial borders. Let us have more of those encounters.


Ashworth, E.J. (2017). Medieval Theories of Analogy, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2017 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

Carrasco, M. (2011). Visual attention: The past 25 years. Vision research, 51(13), 1484-1525.

Dennett, D. (1969). Content and Consciousness. London: Routledge, 1969.

Kitcher, P. (1981). Explanatory unification. Philosophy of science, 48(4), 507-531.

McDaniel, K. (2010). A Return to the Analogy of Being. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 81(3), 688-717.

Priest, G. (2011). Why Asian Philosophy? In G. Oppy and N. Trakakis (eds.) The Antipodean Philosopher. Plymouth: Lexington Books

Salmon, W. C. (1984). Scientific explanation and the causal structure of the world. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Shields, C. J. (2002). Order in multiplicity: Homonymy in the philosophy of Aristotle. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Wilson, J. (2017). Determinables and Determinates, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2017 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).

[1] Ganeri argues (esp. 57-62) that for Buddhaghosa those are closely aligned.

[2] See Ashworth (2017) on Ibn Sīnā’s (Avicenna) contributions.