Placeholder book cover

Wayne Wu, Attention, Routledge, 2014, 313pp., $37.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415532242.

Reviewed by Carolyn Dicey Jennings, University of California, Merced


Like many who work on attention, Wu takes William James as an anchor point, concluding, "So, James was right" (274). In fact, this book can be seen as a continuation of James' project -- as with James' "Attention," Wu's book provides an extensive review of current research on attention.[1] In fact, he engages at length with an impressive amount of work in contemporary philosophy and science, mentioning 10 such researchers – Ned Block, John Campbell, Marisa Carrasco, David Chalmers, David Marr, Christopher Mole, Jesse Prinz, Declan Smithies, George Sperling, and Anne Treisman -- more than 30 times each. Readers interested in contemporary research on attention could learn a great deal from these discussions.[2] The book nonetheless falls short of serving as a complete review of research on attention -- a point Wu in fact accepts (9). Two conspicuous absences include historical philosophy and phenomenology, both of which I discuss briefly below.

Beyond serving as a review, the book develops Wu's philosophical position that "attention is selection for action" (271).[3] Odmar Neumann and Alan Allport introduced selection-for-action as an alternative to the idea that attention emerges from function-general limitations on neural processing (77; Neumann 1987; Allport 1987). They argued that attention instead emerges due to practical limitations, such as the need to couple the neural processing of a particular target to the neural processing of a particular response, given the "many-to-many" possible couplings (Allport 1987, 397). This perspective on attention fits a general trajectory in cognitive science toward more embodied and ecological approaches to the mind.[4] Wu's work fits within this tradition, while also taking the arguments of Allport and Neumann a step further. Although Allport does argue that both attention and selection-for-action depend on "the subject's ability to act voluntarily" (Allport 1987, 414), neither Allport nor Neumann go so far as to identify attention and selection-for-action. Wu, on the other hand, in finding attention necessary and sufficient for selection for action, argues for their metaphysical identity (96). Wu's is a powerful and unique position in the field that I suspect will launch a new area of research on the relationship between attention and action. I nonetheless find the reasoning that grounds his position to be sensitive to an oversight: rather than attention being selection for action, attention may just be a type of action -- active selection. I will discuss this possibility in more detail below.

Wu's overall thesis is a metaphysical one: attention is selection for action (9). To get there, he first argues that research in the psychology (Chapter 1) and neuroscience (Chapter 2) of attention already assumes that selecting a perceptual target for a task is sufficient for attention (11, 72). He next argues (Chapter 3) for an expansion of this condition -- selection for action is sufficient for attention (84). In fact, since action requires selection, according to Wu, attention is necessary for action and agency, in general (90). On the converse side, some form of selection is necessary for attention, and selection for action is a better explanation of the occurrence of attention than selection for consciousness (Chapters 4 through 6), so selection for action is likely necessary for attention (91). Since selection for action is, thus, both necessary and sufficient for attention, we should conclude that attention just is selection for action, according to Wu (96). In the final two chapters (7 and 8), Wu discusses the role of attention in demonstrative thought, introspection, and justification, with an eye to the selection for action account.

Many of the premises in the above argument interact with a notion of the subject or the subject-level. As Wu puts it, "Attention, agency, and mentality are personal level phenomena, in contrast with the sub-personal level. As I use the term, 'personal' refers to a certain category of states or capacities that can be attributed to subjects, namely, mental states and capacities" (87). Some notion of the subject plays a role, for example, in the claim that action requires selection -- "to make action available to a subject, the behavior space must be more complicated than a simple one-one map" (90).[5] So it is availability to the subject that determines whether a behavior is action or reflex, according to Wu, which in turn determines whether the behavior requires attentional selection.

Despite the crucial role of the subject in this argument, discussions on the role of the subject in attention are scarce. In fact, in his introduction Wu taxonomizes contemporary research on attention in several ways, each of which leaves out a subject-centered approach.[6] A subject-centered approach would take the putative source of attention -- the subject -- to be an essential and defining element of attention. Wu's definition of attention at first appears to include such an approach: "This book will settle on a conception of attention as the subject's selecting an item for the purpose of guiding action" (6). Yet, in his first taxonomy, this approach is left out: "From the extant discussions, there are three proposals to consider regarding what attention is: 1) A function-centered approach . . . . 2) A mechanism-centered approach . . . . 3) A phenomenology-centered approach" (5). A subject-centered approach does not fit into any of these categories. In a second taxonomy, Wu separates five questions: "the metaphysical question: What is attention?" (3), "Function: What role does attention play? Properties: What are characteristic features of attention? Mechanism: How is attention implemented? Consciousness: What is the relationship between attention and consciousness?" (7). This list is missing the question: What is the source of attention?

Wu does include some discussion of the relationship between the subject and attention. He first and foremost discusses attention as a "subject-level phenomenon" and says that this means separating selection exhibited by "those states that are attributable to a subject" from selection exhibited by those states that are attributed to "the subject's parts," only the first of which counts as attention (13). Wu then claims that this account of attention "is not very informative," going on to look for other ways of separating attentional from non-attentional selection (finally settling on selection for action). The idea that the role of the subject in mental life is necessary but uninformative can be found in other work -- it crops up in debates on consciousness, for example (Bayne and Chalmers 2003). I nonetheless find it surprising that Wu does not seriously consider the option that it is availability to the subject that distinguishes attentional from non-attentional selection, just as such availability distinguishes action from mere reflex. Attention might in that case be a type of action -- an active selection -- rather than for the sake of action -- a selection for action. At the very least, I suspect that further exploration of subject-centered accounts may well have yielded an informative understanding of attention here, perhaps precluding the need for further specifications.

Returning to Wu's argument, I find that the neglect of subject-centered accounts is detrimental to the reasoning provided for Wu's position. Specifically, I think that reasoning for both the necessary and the sufficient condition is undermined by neglecting this option. The necessary condition is "(N) If S attends to X, then S selects X for performing an action A" (90). Wu's reasoning behind this is that "some form of appropriate selection is required over and above being in a mental state. There are two main options: selection for action and selection for consciousness" (91). Since selection for consciousness fails to track attention and two major objections against selection for action can be addressed, selection for action is the best candidate, Wu argues. This allows us to conclude, according to Wu, that selection for action is necessary for attention (91-95). However, if attention can be understood as essentially selection by a subject, then no particular form of selection need be necessary for attention -- it is just the involvement of the subject (i.e., the subject's activity) that distinguishes attentional from non-attentional selection. Action would only be required for attention, in that case, if we include the act of attending, which would make the point tautologous.

Wu might argue that he set aside this possibility with the claim that "Psychological states . . . do not on their own conceptually entail attention to that item" (91). That is, in some places Wu appears to be arguing that the subject or "personal" level is coextensive with the psychological or mental level, and so saying that attention is selection by a subject is simply saying that this form of selection occurs in psychological space, or due to psychological input. Since psychological states do not require attention, some other factor must necessitate attention, in this line of reasoning. Take this quote on the "Many-Many Problem": "The behavior space that is the basis of the Many-Many Problem is a psychological space, where this implies that the subject takes some psychological attitude towards the input" (87). The idea that the subject or "personal" level and the psychological or mental level are coextensive is unusual, since many researchers accept the existence of sub-personal mental events and dispositions, for which input a subject need not take any attitude at all (e.g., "aliefs" in Gendler 2008). Moreover, this idea does not follow from Wu's "simple division" of the personal from the sub-personal in terms of a whole versus its parts (13): even if we take the subject to be the whole of psychological space, changes at the level of the whole need not occur simply due to changes at the level of its parts. Think of a murmuration of starlings: changes at the level of one starling need not bring about changes at the level of the murmuration. Thus, although Wu may have reasons in mind for setting aside this possibility, those reasons are not transparent from the text itself. Without such reasons, the necessity condition appears to me undermotivated.

The sufficient condition is "(S) If a subject S selects X for some action A, then S attends to X" (83). This condition is an expansion of the "empirical" sufficient condition, which Wu argues is already assumed by experimentalists: "If subject S perceptually selects X for task T, then S perceptually attends to X" (83). Wu reasons that because there is "no principled reason" (84) to separate the relevant experimental tasks from actions, we may as well expand the empirical sufficient condition to include all actions. A principled reason against expansion that I think Wu would accept, if true, is that the relevant experimental tasks, but not all actions, require selection by the subject. Why does Wu ignore this option? As I say above, Wu thinks that all actions require selection by the subject, and that behavior that does not require such selection is pure reflex. But what if action-guiding selection sometimes occurred without the involvement of the subject? Wu says in response to this possibility that

The agent must be implicated in the input that is coupled to the response for the relevant behavior to count as agency . . . . This is why I emphasized that the behavior space must be a psychological space: the inputs imply that the subject bears an appropriate psychological attitude towards them (88).

As in the case of the necessity condition, Wu does not provide an explanation of why something occurring at the psychological level entails its happening at the subject level. He does say in an endnote that "the notion of a subject is taken in the minimal sense of a bearer of psychological states. On this view, being a subject does not entail being an agent, but being an agent does entail being a subject" (104), but this seems to confuse the notion of "the subject" with the notion of "a subject." That is, to argue that the agent, in being a bearer of psychological states, must always be identical to the subject, a bearer of psychological states, we would have to think that there can only ever be one bearer of psychological states. If psychological states always require a bearer, this might explain the idea that the subject level and the psychological level are coextensive. Yet, each of these points requires more justification, without which the argument behind the sufficient condition seems to me incomplete.

In conclusion, I will briefly discuss why I find that the omission of work from historical philosophy and phenomenology detracts from the book's claims. First, the omission of work from the history of philosophy is most apparent in a chapter on "attention in justification and the role of attention in introspection" (243), of which Wu says, "philosophical work in these areas is in an early stage" (243) and, in the summary, "these are issues that philosophers are only beginning to tackle" (267). Against these claims, attention plays a crucial role in discussions on introspection and justification in the work of one of the most famous historical philosophers -- Descartes. Wu misses this connection to attention in his description of Descartes, whose work he does not cite: "Introspection-based beliefs seem in many ways epistemically privileged. One traditional way of understanding privilege is that introspection-based beliefs are certain or infallible. Famously, Descartes made much of this feature in his Meditations" (253). Contrast Wu's description of Descartes' position on introspection with this quote from the Meditations: "for I will assuredly reach truth if I only fix my attention sufficiently on all the things I conceive perfectly, and separate these from others which I conceive more confusedly and obscurely" (1901, 257).[7] That Wu missed this reliance on attention is clear from both his description of Descartes' position on introspection and his claim that work linking attention, introspection, and justification is new to philosophy. The fact that many contemporary scientific texts on attention mention Descartes' contribution (e.g. Hatfield 1998, 5; Tsotsos, Itti, and Rees 2005, xxiii; Cohen 2014, 11) makes this oversight particularly unfortunate for a philosophical work on attention, and I hope that future work will be more inclusive of historical precedent.

The omission of phenomenology is most apparent in the chapter entitled "Attention and Phenomenology," which discusses work by scientists, such as Carrasco and Peter Tse, but not work by phenomenologists, such as Husserl and Merleau-Ponty. After reviewing several scientific experiments on attention, Wu writes,

I have argued that the best approach for the phenomenal conception of attention would be to identify a uniform phenomenology of attention. . . . The previous empirical results suggest that attention can have various and disparate effects on visual experience, but those results do not sit well with the phenomenal conception. (123)

Wu does not, by the end of the chapter, discover a uniform phenomenology of attention, leading him to rule out a phenomenal understanding of the term. This conclusion might be more successful had he considered work by phenomenologists, such as Husserl, or even certain psychologists, such as Edward Titchener (see, e.g. Cohen 2014), who seemingly aim to provide a uniform phenomenology of attention. I refer interested readers to Husserl (1975), who notably discusses the phenomenology of attention in terms of the experience of activity, rather than passivity, but one can also find discussions on the phenomenology of attention in papers by Arvidson (2003), Begout (2007), Depraz (2004), and Vermersch (2004).

Overall, I find this book to be a welcome addition to the philosophical literature on attention. It launches a new and exciting topic of research in attention -- selection for action. I hope that philosophers will be enough inspired by Wu's arguments to continue the discussion on the relationship between attention and action, even while I also hope that such discussion involves more substantial reflection on the role of the subject in both attention and action.


Allport, D. A. (1987). Selection for action. In H. Heuer and H. F. Sanders (eds.), Perspectives on Perception and Action. Lawrence Erlbaum Associates Inc.

Arvidson, P. S. (2003). A lexicon of attention: From cognitive science to phenomenology. Phenomenology and the Cognitive Sciences, 2(2), 99-132.

Bayne, T. and Chalmers, D. (2003). What is the unity of consciousness? In Axel Cleeremans (ed.), The Unity of Consciousness. Oxford University Press.

Bégout, B. (2007). Husserl and the phenomenology of attention. In Rediscovering Phenomenology (pp. 13-32). Springer.

Bruya, B. (2010). Effortless Attention: A New Perspective in the Cognitive Science of Attention and Action. MIT Press.

Bullot, N. (2011). Attention, information, and epistemic perception. In G. Terzis and R. Arp (eds.), Information and Living Systems (pp. 309-352). MIT Press.

Cohen, R. A. (2014). The Neuropsychology of Attention. Springer.

Depraz, N. (2004). Where is the phenomenology of attention that Husserl intended to perform? A transcendental pragmatic-oriented description of attention. Continental Philosophy Review, 37(1), 5-20.

Descartes, R. (1901). The Method, Meditations and Philosophy of Descartes. Tudor Publishing Company.

Gendler, T. S. (2008). Alief and belief. The Journal of Philosophy, 634-663.

Hardcastle, V. G. (1998). The puzzle of attention, the importance of metaphors. Philosophical Psychology, 11(3), 331-351.

Hardcastle, V. G. (2003). Attention versus consciousness. In N. Osaka (ed.), Neural Basis of Consciousness (pp. 105-120). John Benjamins.

Hatfield, G. (1998). Attention in early scientific psychology. Visual Attention, 1, 3-25.

Hommel, B. (2010). Grounding attention in action control: The intentional control of selection. In Bruya (ed.), Effortless Attention (pp. 121-140). MIT Press.

Husserl, E. (1975). Experience and Judgment. Northwestern University Press. (Trans. J. S. Churchill and K. Ameriks).

Itti, L., Rees, G., and Tsotsos, J. K. (Eds.). (2005). Neurobiology of Attention. Academic Press.

Jennings, C. D. (2012). The subject of attention. Synthese, 189(3), 535-554.

Jennings, C. D., and Nanay, B. (2014). Action without attention. Analysis, anu096.

LaBerge, D. (1997). Attention, awareness, and the triangular circuit. Consciousness and Cognition, 6(2), 149-181.

Lau, H. C., Rogers, R. D., Haggard, P., and Passingham, R. E. (2004). Attention to intention. Science, 303(5661), 1208-1210.

Norman, D. A., and Shallice, T. (1986). Attention to action. In R. Davidson, R. Schwartz, and D. Shapiro (eds.), Consciousness and Self-Regulation (pp. 1-18). Springer.

Neumann, O. (1987). Beyond capacity: A functional view of attention. In H. Heuer and H. F. Sanders (eds.), Perspectives on Perception and Action. Lawrence Erlbaum Associates Inc.

Posner, M. I. (1980). Orienting of attention. Quarterly Journal of Experimental Psychology, 32(1), 3-25.

Tallon-Baudry, C. (2004). Attention and awareness in synchrony. Trends in Cognitive Sciences, 8(12), 523-525.

Tallon-Baudry, C. (2011). On the neural mechanisms subserving consciousness and attention. Frontiers in Psychology, 2.

Vermersch, P. (2004). Attention between phenomenology and experimental psychology. Continental Philosophy Review, 37(1), 45-81.

Wu, W. (2008). Visual attention, conceptual content, and doing it right. Mind, 117(468), 1003-1033.

Wu, W. (2011a). Attention as selection for action. In C. Mole, D. Smithies, and W. Wu (eds.), Attention: Philosophical and Psychological Essays (pp. 97-116). Oxford University Press.

Wu, W. (2011b). Confronting Many‐Many problems: Attention and agentive control. Noûs, 45(1), 50-76.

Wykowska, A., and Schubö, A. (2010). On the temporal relation of top-down and bottom-up mechanisms during guidance of attention. Journal of Cognitive Neuroscience, 22(4), 640-654.

[1] The following list of authors, each mentioned five or more times in the book (excluding the acknowledgements and bibliography), should give a sense of its breadth: Allport, Baars, Block, Broadbent, Campbell, Carrasco, Chalmers, Dehaene and Naccache, Dickie, Driver, Duncan, Freeman and Pelli, Gertler, Harman, James, Kahneman, Kentridge, Lamme, Lavie, Mack and Rock, Marr, Mole, Moran and Desimone, Neisser, Neumann, Milner, Phillips, Posner, Prinz, Pylyshyn, Scholl, Shannon, Shomstein, Shulman, Silins and Siegel, Smithies, Sperling, Stazicker, Treisman, Tse, Watzl, Wolfe, Wu, and Yarbus.

[2] Nonetheless, as with any book, there are relevant papers that are not discussed, such as Bruya (2010), Hardcastle (1998, 2003), Hommel (2010), Laberge (1997), Lau et al. (2004), Norman and Shallice (1986), Tallon-Baudry (2004, 2011), and Wykowska and Schubo (2010), which I encourage interested readers to explore alongside this book.

[3] This position is also discussed in Wu (2008, 2011a, and 2011b).

[4] Interested readers can find some discussion of this in Bullot (2011).

[5] See Jennings and Nanay (2014) for more discussion on this particular argument.

[6] I attempt to develop such an approach in Jennings (2012), although I think that the account I provide is far from complete. Wu does cite this paper in a footnote: "Carolyn Dicey Jennings has taken a distinctive position on attention, as well as raising some problems for the selection for action account. She argues (2012) that my (2011b) version of the selection for action account conflates the subject with the agent" (104n2). However, since I did not cite Wu in this paper, I think he is confusing it with an unpublished chapter of my 2012 dissertation, which does discuss his work. In any case, I am going to suppose that Wu is not aware of my discussion of the subject-centered approach.

[7] Descartes writes similarly in the Principles that "the knowledge upon which we can establish a certain and indubitable judgment must be not only clear, but also distinct. I call that clear which is present and manifest to the mind giving attention to it" (1901, 317).