Nature and Normativity: Biology, Teleology, and Meaning

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Mark Okrent, Nature and Normativity: Biology, Teleology, and Meaning, Routledge, 2018, 237pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138244665.

Reviewed by Justin Garson, Hunter College, The City University of New York


The purpose of Okrent's book is to pose and answer two questions: what is a norm (an ought, a should, a supposed to)? And how can there be creatures that are responsive to norms? That is, how can there be creatures that act as they do because that's what they're supposed to do? Okrent's thesis, as indicated by the title, is that norms are rooted in biology; specifically, they're grounded in the organism's need to perpetuate its own existence. Once we understand how norms are grounded in biology, we can understand normative aspects of social roles, tools, and language.

If this project sounds vaguely familiar, it should. Philosophers have been laboring for decades to give a naturalistic account of teleology, and to use this account to understand the nature of social norms, language, and artifacts.[1] This naturalization project stretches back to the 1940s and 1950s, with philosophers and scientists like Norbert Wiener, Gerd Sommerhoff, Richard Braithwaite, and Ernest Nagel. They tried to understand the goal-directedness of machines and animals in fairly abstract cybernetic terms. Theorists in the 1970s and 1980s, like Larry Wright, Ruth Millikan, Karen Neander, and Christopher Boorse, took a more evolutionary line, and tried to make sense of functions and goal-directedness in terms of the current survival needs of organisms or their evolutionary history. Many of those theorists held out hope, and still do, that understanding biological norms can help us understand language, artifacts, and mental representation itself.

Judging by Okrent's book, however, this naturalization project scarcely exists. In fact, a reader who has no background in those issues might even form the impression that Okrent is one of the few philosophers to suspect that normativity can be understood in terms of the survival needs of organisms. To be fair, he spends a few paragraphs contrasting his own approach to teleology with Millikan's, which, he says, represents, "the dominant contemporary naturalistically respectable account of teleological explanation and description" (45), as well as the "received understanding of teleological locutions" (55 fn. 8). After handily disposing with this "received understanding," he develops his own approach to natural teleology without further reference to his philosophical contemporaries.[2]

There are three problems with his decision to distance himself in this way. First, Millikan's approach is far from being the only mainstream approach to naturalizing norms and meaning. In particular, there is a long line of thinkers who have advocated just the approach that Okrent adopts, which takes the goal-directedness of organisms as its point of departure, and which attempts to ground this goal-directedness in the organism's struggle to perpetuate its existence. Second, Okrent freely borrows specific elements from this tradition and neighboring ones. His basic account of goal-directedness, where goal-directedness amounts to a kind of counterfactual robustness, is the standard cybernetic account that was canonized in the 1940s and 1950s and that was promoted by thinkers like Sommerhoff, Braithwaite, Nagel, and later by Boorse. His account of the evolution of norm-responsiveness mirrors Dennett's well-known distinction between Darwinian, Skinnerian, and Popperian creatures. His brief foray into giving truth conditions for simple languages is a variation on the Millikan-Papineau consumer teleosemantics line, though there's no indication in his book that the project of naturalizing semantics exists. The third and final problem is one of substance. By refusing to engage with his contemporaries, he's unable to see certain well-known problems for views like his own, problems that compromise his own project. I'll return to these shortly.

Here's a short overview of the book's seven chapters. Chapter 1 sketches two frameworks that philosophers have used to understand what norms are and how we can be responsive to them. First, there's the Kantian framework, which holds that, for norms to exist, there must be agents that acknowledge those norms. Second, there's the Aristotelian framework, which holds that nature is somehow infused with norms. The heart is supposed to beat; that's just part of what it is to be a heart. One goal of the book is to revive that Aristotelian legacy.

Chapter 2 characterizes life itself as something that inherently stands under a certain norm. What it is to be alive is to be an unlikely pattern of chemical reactions that perpetuates itself into the future. Moreover, there are different ways to act; some lead to more life and some lead to death. That fact alone means there's a right and wrong way for a living thing to act: "Life, as such, carries with it its own norms of appropriate interactions with its environment" (28). This is the primordial norm, the ur-norm from which all others spring.

Okrent then gives a fuller characterization of what an organism is. An organism is made up of parts that have a certain pattern of interaction, and it tends to perpetuate this pattern over time. But that's not all it is to be an organism, since the solar system does the same thing. In addition, an organism can adapt its behavior to changing environmental conditions. It implies a kind of counterfactual robustness: if the environment changed in such-and-such ways, then, within limits, the organism would change its behavior in so-and-so ways, ways that would tend to allow it to survive (34). This is the standard cybernetic account of goal-directedness, sometimes called the "plasticity and persistence" view in the literature.

Chapter 3 develops the idea of norm-responsiveness in more detail. To say that an agent is responsive to a norm is to say that it does what it does because that's the right thing to do. That is, the fact that it should do something is part of an explanation for what it does do. But how can we explain what an organism does in terms of what it should do? Okrent thinks that, if an organism's behavior exhibits this sort of counterfactual robustness, then that grounds an explanation of what it does do in terms of what it should do (65).

Still, the norm-responsiveness of simple organisms like bacteria is extremely limited. They can't learn from mistakes. Over time, however, evolution created an organism that was capable of learning, that is, of modifying its behavior in response to mistakes. But even this simple sort of learning, operant conditioning, is imperfect, since we can learn the wrong lessons from life. Fortunately, evolution eventually made an even better sort of organism, an instrumentally rational one. Such organisms are capable of making inferences about the properties of things and the likely effects of different courses of action; it's appropriate to say of such creatures that they have genuine beliefs and desires (86).

Chapter 4 introduces a new kind of norm, a "non-instrumental" norm; he uses the word "ought" rather than "should" to designate this class of norms. These are norms that pertain more closely to social roles, tool-use, and language, and they aren't grounded as directly in the needs of survival as the other sort. These include norms of etiquette, norms of what it is to be a good philosopher, spouse, or carpenter, norms of how to use adjectives and adverbs. Importantly, humans aren't the only animals responsive to these non-instrumental norms; baboons are too. Their social roles are associated with various non-instrumental norms (like dominant and non-dominant females). How can there be an animal that's sensitive to oughts? The key is that, even if these oughts aren't directly grounded in the needs of survival, they're indirectly so. That's because we're social animals and we need to fulfill our social roles well to survive as a group.

Chapter 5 turns to the difference between people and baboons as far as social roles go. An obvious difference is that, next to baboons, there's an incredible amount of variability in the social roles available to people. What gives us so much flexibility in how we design and carry out our social roles? Humans are uniquely sensitive to two-dimensional norms. A two-dimensional norm, if I understand it correctly, is a norm that specifies both an end that something is to be used for, and a method by which it is supposed to be used. Consider a carpenter. The carpenter ought to make things out of wood. That is the carpenter's goal or end. But the carpenter is supposed to accomplish this goal in a certain way; that is, carpenters ought to adhere to socially established methods for building things out of wood. These two sorts of norms can come into conflict. That's because a carpenter might figure out a new, more efficient, method for building houses, a method that flouts convention. This might be socially disruptive, and society then has to figure out how to resolve such conflicts. In resolving these conflicts, society adapts to changing environmental conditions.

Chapters 6 and 7 turn to language. The main purpose of language is to help transform our social roles and structures to adapt to new environments, and specifically, to resolve the conflicts that arise due to our sensitivity to two-dimensional norms. Okrent also uses these two-dimensional norms to understand certain features of language like displacement (we can talk about things that aren't present), subject-predicate structure, and truth conditions. Consider truth conditions. Suppose someone in the group yells "rhino" to alert the group to a dead rhino over the hill. In order for the group to be motivated to go and get the rhino, they have to understand that the word "rhino" is a kind of tool, and like all tools, stands under two sorts of norms. First, it has a certain end, namely, to correlate with the presence of rhinos. Second, it has a manner of appropriate use: it's supposed to alert the members of the group to the presence of rhinos so that they'll act in the right way. The truth condition for the rhino call is whatever must be the case for that group action to be successful: namely, there's a dead rhino nearby (190). As I mentioned, this is effectively the fusion of success semantics and teleosemantics championed by theorists like Millikan and Papineau. This is another missed opportunity, as Okrent makes no attempt to engage the rich and ongoing project of naturalizing semantics.

As I said, a big problem for the book isn't just one of positioning itself appropriately in relation to a broader stream of philosophical work; it's one of substance, too. Okrent's tradition of thinking about teleology, where norms depend on goal-directedness, and goal-directedness on counterfactual robustness, is beset by well-known problems.[3] Perhaps the most serious is the problem of vacuity: it's almost impossible to produce an analysis that distinguishes systems that are genuinely goal-directed (a toad orienting its head to strike a worm) from systems that aren't (a ball rolling to the bottom of a bowl). Other problems include the problem of multiple goals. If an organism is goal-directed toward end E, and end E always leads to F, then, on standard accounts, the organism is goal-directed toward F, too. If a bit of mouse behavior is goal-directed toward eating cheese, and every time it eats cheese it defecates, then that behavior is also goal-directed toward defecating.

Here's how the vacuity objection affects Okrent's project. Okrent says that normativity is ultimately rooted in the organism's need to survive. So, what is an organism? An organism is a system made up of parts that interact in such a way that the system (generally) perpetuates itself over time. Moreover, it exhibits counterfactual robustness: within a certain range, if the environment differed in some ways, it would change its behavior accordingly so as to stay alive (98). The problem is that the exact same thing can be said of any far-from-equilibrium system, like candle flames or hurricanes. A candle flame is a system that's made up of a bunch of parts that interact with each other and with the environment in such a way as to maintain the flame; within a range of environments, it can modify its behavior in order to persist.[4] (Try blowing on one gently and you'll see it modify its behavior in such a way as to persist.) But candle flames don't stand under norms; there's no right or wrong way for them to act. So, this seems like the wrong place to look for understanding the norms of nature.

How do we get around the vacuity objection? The standard approach is to go anti-realist. Ernest Nagel ultimately concluded that whether or not a system is goal-directed depends on how humans analyze it. Dan McShea also suggests that whether or not a system is goal-directed is relative to our state of knowledge about it.[5] But Okrent can't take this road. The problem is that the anti-realist line grounds "genuine" goal-directedness in the explanatory needs of humans, and specifically, those humans that occupy a certain social role, scientists. But we're trying to use goal-directedness to explain how creatures can have explanatory needs, and how there can be social roles, so if Okrent took this path, the whole project would be circular.

The book does have its merits.  Okrent makes a very interesting move when he suggests that, in order to understand artifacts like tools, and in order to understand aspects of language like displacement, we must first understand the normative aspects of social roles. For example, one can't understand what hammers are unless one considers hammers in relation to what other tools do and ultimately in relation to what carpenters are (135), and the same goes for language. I suspect this line of thought might have rich consequences for naturalistic approaches to understanding artifacts and language: look first to how social roles work, and then work forward to a theory of language and tools. On the whole, this would have been a much better book had Okrent showed how his insights build upon and contribute to an existing body of literature, and had he tried to work out the consequences for that literature in a systematic way.

[1] My What Biological Functions Are and Why They Matter (Cambridge University Press, forthcoming), and its companion volume, A Critical Overview of Biological Functions (Springer, 2016), give an up-to-date assessment.

[2] Okrent notes, in the footnote on Millikan, that his earlier book, Rational Animals: The Teleological Roots of Intentionality (Ohio University Press, 2007), contains a more extensive discussion of Millikan. One might think, in the spirit of charity, that his earlier book engaged all of the goal-directedness thinkers appropriately, and that this book just sets the issue to one side so he can get on with the positive project. But the earlier book is hardly an advance. There, he positions his naturalization project in relation to exactly two others: Millikan and Wright. He quickly dismantles' Wright's approach to goal-directedness (which was never well-developed anyway). None of the other philosophers that should have made an appearance do.

[3] See Scheffler, I. (1959), "Thoughts on Teleology," British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 9: 265-284.

[4] As pointed out by Mossio et al. (2009), "An Organizational Account of Biological Functions," British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 60: 813-841.

[5] See Nagel, E. (1977), "Teleology Revisited: Goal Directed Processes in Biology and Functional Explanation in Biology," Journal of Philosophy 74: 261-301; McShea, D. (2012), "Upper-directed Systems: A New Approach to Teleology in Biology," Biology and Philosophy 27: 663-684.