Augustine: A New Biography

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James J. O'Donnell, Augustine: A New Biography, HarperCollins Publishers, 2005, 396pp., $26.95 (hbk), ISBN 0060535377. (Published in the United Kingdom as Augustine, Sinner and Saint: A New Biography, Profile Books, 2005, 396pp., £25.00 (hbk), ISBN 1861976860.)

Reviewed by Thomas Williams, University of South Florida


This book, O'Donnell tells us, is about two Augustines: "the one who lived and died a long time ago and the one who lives to be remade by us and is known from his works" (5). The first of these was a jerk; the second is an illusion, artfully created by the jerk.

'Jerk' is my word, not O'Donnell's. He prefers 'snob' (41) and 'zealot' (41, 45). O'Donnell's Augustine is self-dramatizing; his Christianity is "ostentatious" (90) and he "always put on a show" (119). He is a contemptible social climber, "always on the make" (89), with a "tendency to curry favor upwards" (90). The fact that this is not the Augustine many of us think we know is a testament, O'Donnell believes, to Augustine's remarkable power for constructing a public self, especially in the Confessions, that "work of extraordinary artifice" (6). "To understand Augustine's life," O'Donnell says, "we need to be cunning in evading the snares he has laid for his biographers, but still we need to respect him and his own version of the story. If we will wring a real confession or two from him against his will, we must first listen to the story he wants to tell us" (37). O'Donnell says he'll tell us the story without comment, but he does actually comment, and never flatteringly: Augustine's sexual temptation is "described with great circumlocution" (38); the theft of the pears "is recounted at puzzling length" (38); we have "every reason to suspect that the bishop rather overdid the accusations against his younger self" (38); "The study of philosophy obtruded and led to religious zealotry" (39); Augustine "worked himself up into a crisis" (40). By contrast, when O'Donnell imagines how a Donatist from Hippo would have told the story, he presents the "hostile counternarrative" (52) almost without comment.

For O'Donnell, one of Augustine's greatest successes in rewriting the story of his life is that he "suppresses the importance of the Manichee phase" (44). Augustine asks us to believe that his Manicheism was never terribly serious, but contemporaries of Augustine suspected that he never fully got Manicheism out of his system. O'Donnell is inclined to credit such suspicions, certainly more than he is inclined to credit what Augustine tells us of himself. O'Donnell writes:

Manicheism was with him early and late, and was the one truly impassioned religious experience of his life. He was the sort of person who has a great love affair when young, sees that it just won't work, breaks it off, then settles down in a far more sober and sensible marriage. What he says and does for the rest of his life will be marked by firm allegiance and commitment to the late-blooming relationship, but the mark of the first never goes away, and some who knew him early will be unable to credit the marriage because they remember the passion. (47)

Yet O'Donnell does allow us to consider the judgment of Augustine's old Manichee buddy Secundinus: "it seems to me, and it's quite true, that you never really were a Manichee… . You were a chaste man, pure and poor, but you went over to the barbarous tribes of the Jews and you fill your teaching with their silly fables" (45-46). We might wonder: where is the evidence that Augustine's Manicheism was a truly impassioned religious experience, let alone "the one truly impassioned religious experience of his life"? O'Donnell's own description of Augustine's allegiance to the Manichees doesn't make it sound impassioned at all. What does come across is the fact that the questions that drove him to Manicheism continued to preoccupy him, even as he gave them Christian rather than Manichee answers -- especially concerning the origin of evil. But to argue that this preoccupation "continued to mark him as one who had been in their number and been marked by them for life" (50) seems backwards, since his Manicheism -- O'Donnell seems to concede this much, at least, of Augustine's authorized self-description -- derived from his interest in the origin of evil; it was not the other way around. We must note as well that the Manichees demanded continence from their "elect," much as Ambrosian Christians did. Augustine committed to Christianity in a way that he never committed to Manicheism.

What would we say about Augustine if we did not have the Confessions? Nothing very complimentary, O'Donnell speculates. These lines will give something of the flavor:

Though some pages of his sermons have a discreet mystical charm, and though his City of God is a surprisingly effective tour de force defense of a rather forced Christian view of history, the vast bulk of his endlessly and tediously polemical writings against his many enemies weighs down our impression of him beyond recall. He is too like Jerome in his readiness to hate, and too unlike Jerome in his somber, plodding style and his superficial learning. He has verbal facility, but he cannot bring it alive for more than brief flashes… . He succeeded in destroying the morale and the organization of the native African Christian Church, the so-called Donatists, and left it a prey to the combined forces of Arians and Vandals who arrived in Africa just as he was dying. He did his church few favors, and he had few friends… . He set a style for ambitious churchmen aligned with state authority that had hitherto been seen mainly in the Greek east. His transfer of that model to the west is perhaps the most baleful of his achievements. (80-81)

It seems to be O'Donnell's aim in this book to convince us that the scheming ecclesiastic and plodding writer described here is the real Augustine. We think otherwise only because we have succumbed to "the gravitational force of that immense and powerful book" (81), the Confessions.

Let us look more closely at Augustine's efforts against the Donatists, since these loom large in the description of the Augustine we would be able to see if it were not for the fraudulent Confessions. O'Donnell's overarching argument here is that the notion of a unitary "Catholic Church" clearly distinguished from heretical groups "is something that was invented and propagated, and Augustine's own history is a part of that process" (209). Augustine's role in the propagation of this notion was as a participant in the dispute between the Donatist party -- much the larger of the two factions, as O'Donnell frequently tells us -- and what Augustine would have us call the catholics but O'Donnell calls the Caecilianists. O'Donnell speculates that Augustine struck "the initial blows" that weakened "the oldest and strongest-rooted Christianity in the Latin world." We just can't know, he says, "the extent to which the disruption of traditional loyalties and hierarchies by the putsch against the Donatists, led by Augustine and his friends, weakened the cohesiveness and powers of resistance of African Christianity" (224). Forget about the inflammatory word (the title of the chapter is "The Augustinian Putsch in Africa"): does Augustine really do anything so terribly bad in all this? Certainly, on O'Donnell's own telling, he does nothing unprecedented, for the Donatists in their time of ascendancy had done violence, terrorized, and appealed to imperial force against the Caecilianists. Augustine seems content to enlist the power of the state on his side, a willingness that violates our twenty-first-century liberal sensibilities but seems almost ostentatiously restrained by the standards of the time.

The turning point in the dispute came in 411, when Augustine's party prevailed against the Donatists. Surprisingly, there is very little indication in O'Donnell's narrative that Augustine was particularly active or effective in ensuring this triumph. Instead, it seems as though the real importance of 411 was that it brought Augustine into contact with Marcellinus, the imperial official assigned the task of resolving the dispute. Through Marcellinus, Augustine became acquainted with Rufius Antonius Agrypnius Volusianus, who gave him the idea for City of God. Even more fatefully, perhaps, Marcellinus also made Augustine aware of the influence of Pelagius. Thus the narrative turns to "Augustine's great failure," as the title of Chapter X describes the polemic against Pelagius and Julian of Eclanum. "The anti-Julian works," O'Donnell writes, "resolutely deter affection, fascination, or even respect, and they make wearying and dispiriting reading, even for his most kindly disposed students" -- though he is willing to admit that Julian is "scarcely more attractive" (283).

In discussing all three of Augustine's great polemics -- against the Manichees, the Donatists, and the Pelagians -- O'Donnell flirts with the most unflattering and reductive explanations available. The anti-Manichee polemic disguised Augustine's failure to shake off his own Manichean leanings. The anti-Donatist polemic was born of zealotry and snobbery (41). The anti-Pelagian polemic arose because Augustine saw (and hated) in Pelagius a version of his younger self, a rival "for the affections and attention of the well-connected Romans whose support Augustine craved so strongly throughout his career" (254; cf. 274-275). I have already raised questions about O'Donnell's reading of the anti-Manichee polemic. I can support my doubts about his reading of the other two with materials from O'Donnell himself, although he provides them in an unexpected context.

Quoting the famous passage from the opening of the Soliloquies in which Augustine says he wants to know only God and the soul, O'Donnell surveys Augustine's theology by examining first his doctrine of God and then his understanding of the human person. Augustine's God is both unsayable and silent. He is also a Trinity-in-unity: a point that for O'Donnell arises only when we turn to Augustine's anthropology, with its "relentless" (295) insistence that human beings are created in the image of the trinitarian life. But what really interests O'Donnell in Augustine's anthropology is the "doctrine of original sin, his most original and nearly single-handed creation" (296). Here, without perhaps meaning to, O'Donnell offers us some insight into the motivation for Augustine's uncompromising anti-Donatist polemics. Part of what drives Augustine to the doctrine of original sin, it seems, is his own experience of continued struggle to express the Christian faith in both word and deed: "Bodies ache and die, half-controlled sexuality defiles the spirit, and even language comes apart in one's hands as meaning disintegrates" (298). As a result, "Christian life here and now loses, in the Augustinian view, much of its charm and certainly loses any flavor of an exclusive club for the smugly redeemed" (298) -- loses, in other words, any right to be construed as the Donatists construed it. As for Augustine's anti-Pelagian polemic, O'Donnell acknowledges that some of its intensity derived from his fear "of an all-powerful father who punishes unjustly and heeds no plea" (300). The Pelagians "seemed to leave the door open to a divine tyrant" (300; the argument for this claim is not altogether straightforward). So for Augustine the doctrine of original sin is not only an indictment of the human condition; it is also intended as a vindication of the divine character. We need not accept Augustine's doctrine or admire his polemic to see in these considerations a more promising line of inquiry than one that writes off the anti-Pelagian works as the obsessions of an embittered old grouch.

O'Donnell's book leaves it altogether mysterious how this man, whose success in this life was apparently attributable entirely to his skills as a social climber, political suck-up, and ecclesiastical bomb-thrower, could have had such enduring influence after his life, when such skills can no longer be put to use. We cannot even attribute it to Augustine's masterly self-construction in his evasive and fraudulent Confessions, since (as O'Donnell tells us) no one paid much attention to that work for many centuries during which Augustine was a preeminent authority. In only one place does O'Donnell give us an indication of what anyone might have seen in Augustine's writing:

It requires no partisanship and not even any approval of a single word he wrote to stand nevertheless in awe of his independence of mind, his freshness of approach, and the novelty of the questions he asked. Each time he takes up the task of writing, he approaches his subject afresh, asking good questions. Where Augustine repeats himself, he becomes the jazz improvisationalist, repeating old themes but never in the same way. Though many themes, expressions, and ideas recur in Augustine, few if any of his works may be dismissed out of hand as a simple rehash of something that has gone before. Sermon after sermon and work after work does something he has not done before, asks some new question, presses some new line of argument. He is not dependent on others for the questions that press him, though he exploits the curiosity of others with rare resourcefulness… . The way in which Augustine continued to ask questions, fresh questions, and to press his inquiries well into late middle age has a moral elegance about it. Even in the gloomy days of whaling away at Julian, a fair reading will show that the strength of mind and the freshness of approach was still there, however the atmosphere had clouded. (309).

In both tone and content, this appreciation of Augustine seems to belong to an entirely different book. One could wish that O'Donnell had written the biography of that Augustine.