Augustine and Roman Virtue

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Brian Harding, Augustine and Roman Virtue, Continuum, 2008, 207pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847062857.

Reviewed by Bonnie Kent, University of California at Irvine



Marcus Varro wrote so much that it is hard to believe that anyone has read it all — or so says Augustine in City of God (VI, 2). Today we have trouble believing that anyone has read all of the surviving works by Augustine himself. How many people have even read City of God cover to cover? In philosophical circles, the claim to have done so would probably trigger a mixed reaction: admiration for the sheer persistence needed to accomplish this feat, plus doubts about whether the time was wisely invested. We feel no shame about reading only a fraction of Augustine’s magnum opus because it looks long on (boring) story-telling and Christian invective but depressingly short on philosophical arguments. Too often he seems to be trashing pagans without really arguing against them. Brian Harding’s Augustine and Roman Virtue works mightily to correct this negative impression. It does so partly by challenging “the sacralization thesis” (hereafter, the S.T.), and partly by giving enough background on (now) little-known Roman sources for readers to appreciate how Augustine is indeed arguing against them.

According to Harding, the S.T. treats Christianity and philosophy as “heteronymous and antagonistic,” claims that Christianity prevails over philosophy “due to extra-philosophical or extra-rational causes,” and concludes that “Latin medieval thought is philosophically suspect” (pp. 30-31). Arguments against the S.T., developed in Chapter 1 and recapped in Chapter 5, frame the book as a whole. In Chapters 2-4, which together constitute two-thirds of the book, Harding sets himself the more modest task of exploring the critique of ancient virtue in City of God: not only Augustine’s “anti-eudemonistic theory of virtue” but also the sources of his concept of “the lust for domination” and how he uses it (p. 32). On the whole, the modest project of Chapters 2-4 goes well. When restored to their proper historical context, parts of City which at first looked like theological invective, pedantic embellishments, or some combination of the two, emerge as interesting elements in Augustine’s “immanent critique” of ancient virtue. Harding’s discussion of the S.T. strikes me as less successful, mainly for two reasons. First, I cannot be sure whether he wants to prove something about “the birth of medieval philosophy, in particular in its Augustinian form” (p. x), or something about “medieval Augustinianism” (p. 165), or something about “medieval Latin [Christian] philosophy” in general (p. 31). The wider one takes the topic to be, the less persuasive the author’s case becomes. Second, he makes no serious effort to establish that the S.T. — however influential it may have been in the early modern period — plays a major role in shaping present-day views of medieval philosophy in general or of Augustine’s thought in particular. Who actually defends the S.T.? Harding focuses overwhelmingly on two authors: John Milbank, an English theologian little known to most philosophical readers, and Pierre Hadot, a French historian of ancient philosophy whose works have yet to attract wide attention in the Anglophone world.

The choice of targets in Chapter 1, like the idiosyncratic bibliography, reveals a frustrating aspect of the book as a whole. It discusses works familiar to relatively few denizens of Anglophone philosophy departments while ignoring better-known works of direct relevance to the author’s topic. Hence works by Hadot become the chief target for arguments about philosophy as a way of life. No matter that Alexander Nehamas (e.g., The Art of Living, 1998) has much to say about philosophy as a way of life; his work goes unmentioned. If Harding wants scholarly work focused on ancient philosophy as a way of life, would it not be appropriate to discuss Julia Annas’s The Morality of Happiness (1993)? Maybe it would be, but Harding only mentions Annas’s work in passing (pp. 126, 143), explaining in a footnote that he favors Hadot’s work precisely because it ventures “major historical-philosophical claims” and generally demonstrates less caution (p. 169 n. 68). He never explains why works by the French medievalist, Alain de Libera, win far more attention in his book than works by any medievalists native to the U.S. or the U.K. (Mainly because de Libera, like Hadot, makes an easier target?)

Thanks to this strangely selective use of secondary literature, important questions remain unanswered. Two examples must suffice: (1) How does Augustine and Roman Virtue differ from Gerard O’Daly’s magisterial Augustine’s City of God: A Reader’s Guide (1999)? While the first plainly has a more narrow focus than the second, it would be interesting to know which aspects of O’Daly’s interepretation, if any, Harding disputes. (2) What does Harding make of John Inglis’s Spheres of Philosophical Inquiry and the Historiography of Medieval Philosophy (1998)? As Inglis sees it, the early modern view of medieval philosophy as subservient to theology was heavily undermined by Joseph Kleutgen and Albert Stöckl, German scholars of the nineteenth century. The Kleutgen-Stöckl model divided medieval thought into then-standard philosophical “spheres” like logic, metaphysics, epistemology, moral and political philosophy. Making epistemology central, it cast Aquinas’s work as the finest example of medieval philosophy as an autonomous discipline. Why should anyone care about these obscure German historians? Because, Inglis argues, the same basic model survives in later histories of medieval philosophy running all the way from Maurice De Wulf’s and Etienne Gilson’s through The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy.

I wonder how Harding would reply to this pioneering work in the historiography of medieval philosophy. Would he protest that Inglis exaggerates the influence of the Kleutgen-Stöckl model? (Maybe it prevails only in Anglo-American histories of philosophy, or only in histories of medieval philosophy but not in big-sweep histories, or even merely in Anglo-American histories of medieval philosophy.) Would he argue that this model itself at least partly perpetuates the S.T., so that it does not escape his own critique entirely unscathed? Or would he take some other approach? If Harding locked horns with Inglis, he might be driven to clarify his own views about the place of Thomas Aquinas in both the real-world development and the historiography of medieval philosophy. As it stands, his views on these topics can only be guessed on the basis of a few scattered passages. Harding has so little to say about Aquinas that Aquinas’s name doesn’t even merit an entry in his book’s index of names and places.

We turn now from the rather weak, fuzzy framework of Augustine and Roman Virtue to its stronger, clearer core (Chapters 2-4). Harding begins this section by explaining why people today usually misread Augustine’s attack on pagans’ civic virtue in City of God:

There is an important — and often overlooked — aspect of Augustine’s discussion of civic virtue: it is an entirely Roman discussion. There is a tendency amongst philosophers — who love all things Greek — to collapse Roman virtue into Greek virtue. To be sure, one can point to specialists in Greek and Roman thought who would vehemently deny this charge; they are, in any case, not the targets. Although they have avoided this error, it is a habit both ancient and widespread (p. 35).

Harding continues by noting that we already find much the same reduction of Rome to Greece in modern works such as Hume’s Natural History of Religion and Nietzsche’s Genealogy of Morals.

Surely various philosophers of the West have tended to lump Roman moral thought together with Greek moral thought, as if there were no significant differences between them. This tendency is especially pronounced today, when most readers have read pitifully little Roman philosophy and even less Roman history and literature. (Even in the last couple of decades, as leading scholars of ancient philosophy moved beyond their old obsession with the Presocratics, Plato, and Aristotle into serious research on Hellenistic philosophy, most have given Roman philosophy short shrift.) For this very reason Harding’s Chapter 2, “Roman Virtue and the Lust for Domination”, labors mainly to remedy our ignorance of the Romans.

I strongly recommend this chapter to students of the history of ethics interested in learning about the Roman period but not interested enough to slog through long, dry scholarly monographs. It would be hard to find another discussion of works like Cicero’s Republic and Sallust’s Cataline Conspiracy so concise and engaging. More important, the chapter shows that motifs readers now usually see as Christian — not only claims about the universal human lust for domination but also admiration for poverty, ambivalence about magnanimity as a virtue, and worries about pride as a source of vice — actually have their roots in pre-Christian Roman culture. Harding shows, too, that the Romans tended to disparage the Greeks for merely writing about virtue; they boasted of their own superiority in practicing it (p. 38).

The conviction that people’s understanding of virtue should be judged by how they live, not merely by the theories of virtue devised by a select group of philosophers, figures prominently in both City of God and Harding’s interpretation of it. He argues that Augustine begins City by criticizing the pseudo-virtues displayed (historically) by Rome’s foremost citizens, progresses to criticizing the pseudo-virtues extolled in works by pagan philosophers, and only after his long “immanent critique” presents his own Christian conception of virtue as an alternative. This reading proves far more convincing than Milbank’s, which insists that Augustine never attempts to show the failure of pagan Rome by philosophical arguments, but merely retells the story of Rome from a Christian perspective, effectively inviting readers to choose which narrative they like best (pp. 18, 71-72, 142).

Harding’s interpretation can explain why Augustine discusses Cato’s suicide in Book I of City, then returns to it in Book XIX. It merits attention in Book I as a suicide motivated by Roman civic virtue. Augustine returns to it in Book XIX because it can equally be seen as a philosophical suicide influenced by Stoic ideals (p. 99). Another example of how Harding’s interpretation acquits Augustine of needless repetition: the murder of Remus by his brother Romulus, the storied founder of Rome, appears first in Book III of City, then again in Book XV. The first account, belonging to Augustine’s immanent critique of Roman virtue, expands on doubts already raised in Cicero’s On Duties about whether Romulus’s killing of Remus was honorable (or even justified). Here, Harding contends, Augustine’s treatment of the Romulus story relies on no theological elements at all. Only when Augustine revisits the story in Book XV does he relate it to Cain’s killing of Abel: the world’s first fratricide, which Augustine thinks marks the founding of the Earthly City (pp. 75-77).

Alas, Milbank’s reading of City of God gains support from textbooks often used in undergraduate philosophy courses. For two examples see Steven Cahn’s Classics of Political and Moral Philosophy (2002) and Michael Morgan’s Classics of Moral and Political Theory (4th ed., 2005). Both include only some selections from Book XIX of City, omitting the long preliminary line of argument that Harding traces. How sad that even laborious research on the historiography of philosophy, such as Inglis’s, focuses so heavily on scholarly monographs and anthologies! I fear that decisions made by today’s textbook editors might actually do as much or more to shape the prevailing view of medieval philosophy in general and Augustine in particular. Factor in the standard pedagogical preference for separate titles both short and relatively inexpensive, such as Augustine’s On Free Choice of the Will, and it might turn out that Hackett Publishing has done more to shape the dominant view of Augustine today than all of the world’s historical scholars combined.

Specialists in patristics probably already know that the universal lust for domination, introduced at the beginning of City of God as a major theme, was hardly some Augustinian innovation — mainly because Harald Hagendahl’s masterpiece, Augustine and the Latin Classics (2 vols., 1967), devotes plenty of space to demonstrating Augustine’s huge debt to Sallust. Nevertheless where Hagendahl concludes that Augustine contributes nothing new or original on this topic, Harding argues forcefully to the contrary. This gives him added ammunition in his battle against the S.T., which denigrates, even flatly denies, Augustine’s success in arguing with ancient philosophers on their own terms (pp. 87-92, 135-48).

The main body of Augustine and Roman Virtue runs to 165 pages; pp. 165-90 contain endnotes; and the volume ends with a bibliography, an index of names and places, and an index of terms. Notably absent from the second index is the term “eudemonism,” which figures so prominently in the text. Like so many authors, Harding never offers a clear explanation of what he means by the now-popular term “eudemonism.” As a result, I cannot say exactly what he means in describing Augustine’s theory of virtue as “anti-eudemonistic” (p. 32 and passim). The rapid multiplication of eudaimonisms towards the end of the book — including “political eudemonism,” “ethical eudemonism,” “eschatological eudemonism,” and “delayed eudemonism” (pp. 137, 158) — do little to relieve my confusion. So I can only guess that when the author describes Augustine’s theory of virtue as “anti-eudemonistic,” he has in mind Augustine’s denial that virtue is sufficient for happiness, or that happiness is attainable through our own efforts, or that happiness is attainable in the present life, or (most likely) all three. He plainly cannot mean that Augustine opposes all versions of eudemonism because the final chapter treats Augustine’s own thought as a form of eudemonism. Readers who begin by assuming that Harding thinks Augustine is committed to the kind of dualism about human motivation later displayed by Anselm, Scotus, and Kant are therefore doomed to disappointment. His penchant for revisionism operates within more narrow bounds.