Augustine and Spinoza

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Milad Doueihi, Augustine and Spinoza, Jane Marie Todd (tr.), Harvard University Press, 2010, 116pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674050631.

Reviewed by Carlos Fraenkel, McGill University


Spinoza tells us little about his philosophical sources. In particular the Ethics is presented as a creation out of nothing but logical inferences from definitions and first axioms. Many scholars have taken this as a challenge to reconstruct the critical dialogue with past and contemporary philosophers that, in fact, shaped Spinoza's thought. Prevalent in this regard have been readings of Spinoza in light of Descartes and Hobbes on the one hand and in light of medieval Jewish philosophy on the other. But Spinoza has also been related to Platonic, Epicurean, and Stoic sources, as well as to Christian theological traditions -- often in their early-modern versions. If done well, these studies indeed illuminate important aspects of Spinoza's thought.

Another way to approach Spinoza's sources is more philosophical than historical. It examines the debate in which Spinoza engages predecessors and contemporaries on important philosophical questions. Leon Roth's 1924 book -- Spinoza, Descartes, and Maimonides -- may serve as an example: he sets the position of medieval Muslim Kalâm theologians and Descartes against the position of Maimonides and Spinoza, drawing out their conflicting metaphysical, epistemological, and ethical implications. Of course the best historical studies on Spinoza (of which Roth's is one) use the tools of both the historian and the philosopher.

Milad Doueihi's book, Augustine and Spinoza, falls into neither of these categories. He is not interested in showing how Spinoza responds to Augustine and -- more importantly -- to traditions of Augustinianism that were part of the intellectual setting of the seventeenth century. Nor does he try to think through the issues on which Augustine and Spinoza would have agreed or disagreed had they met for a philosophical discussion. That is unfortunate in my view, for both approaches -- and, of course, their combination -- could have yielded interesting results. Spinoza surely encountered Augustinianism in various forms -- from the different strands of the Reform movement (both Protestant and Catholic) that appealed to Augustine when criticizing the theology of the scholastics, to Descartes whose "new" philosophy in important ways can be described as an Augustinian project.[1] And if we imagine Augustine and Spinoza getting together for a discussion, they surely would have had much to talk about: beginning with their conversion experiences which led both to turn away from inferior goods to God -- "honor, wealth, and marriage" in Augustine's case (Confessions, VI.6); "wealth, honor, and sensual pleasure" in Spinoza's (Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect, 3) -- to questions about metaphysics, the human will, the highest good, and the relationship between philosophy and religion.

The position of Augustine's early Christian writings offers a good starting point for a conversation with Spinoza. Recall that the "books of the Platonists" -- most importantly Plotinus -- played a crucial role in Augustine's conversion from Manichaeism (via skepticism) to Christianity (cp. Confessions VII). The first question Augustine and Spinoza might examine is how the God of "the Platonists" differs from the God of Spinoza given that both necessarily cause all possible things. Spinoza would likely challenge Augustine on the problem of moral evil: if God is the cause of all things, how can moral evil arise from free will? On the other hand, I would expect Augustine to agree with Spinoza that "knowledge and love of God is the greatest good," as opposed to satisfying "fleshly appetites" which are the "chief delight" of "carnal man" (Tractatus Theologico-Politicus 4 [hereafter TTP]). Moreover, at this stage Christ for Augustine is just "a man of exceeding wisdom" (Confessions VII.19) whom God, "by a democratic clemency," sent to teach philosophy to the many (Against the Academics III.19) -- rather like Spinoza's Christ who conveys "eternal truths" in the form of "parables" and "laws" to those who have "not yet been granted to see the Kingdom of Heaven" (TTP 4). Augustine might have considered whether Spinoza's monism could help in solving what for a Platonic dualist must have been the greatest Christian stumbling block: the doctrine of the Incarnation. As for the later Augustine, Spinoza would have been curious to find out what led him to an increasingly voluntaristic interpretation of God's omnipotence. He would have had a hard time with the arbitrary way Augustine's God decides about salvation and damnation and with how Augustine makes salvation dependent on God's grace. But let me stop reviewing the book I wish Doueihi had written and turn to the one he actually wrote.

At the end of the introduction Doueihi makes an ambitious claim: his book "is in Friedrich Nietzsche's sense both philological and untimely" (8). According to Nietzsche, classical philology -- his own academic field -- is useful only if it is "untimely," i.e., exercises an influence "contrary to our time, and hence on our time, and hopefully for the benefit of a future time" (On the Use and Abuse of History for Life, Prologue). Unfortunately, Doueihi does not spell out how his reading of Augustine and Spinoza is "untimely." In the conclusion he stresses that the key difference between them is "the cleavage between theology and philosophy … Their two paths represent tendencies that continue to haunt and incite the modern and contemporary discourse on monotheistic religion, its cultural legacy, and its philosophical interpretation" (85). It seems clear, then, that Doueihi sees his study as something more than a contribution to historical scholarship. Just what that is he does not tell us.

Nietzsche's reflection on history is also a critique of the historical science of his day: the work of the historian must be put into the service of life rather than suffocating it through scientific pretensions. Perhaps this explains why Doueihi sees no need to burden his readers with a discussion of previous scholarship. He is confident that "the problem of election … offers us the best entry into the unexplored territory between Augustine and Spinoza" (3). By "election" Doueihi means the claim of the Jews to be God's chosen people, as well as the complicated transition from the old to the new covenant and the consequent transformation of the concept of election -- from Jewish particularism to Christian universalism and from a body of externally imposed laws to the laws of the heart in every human being (cp. ibid.). For both Augustine and Spinoza, Doueihi contends, "the question of election" is constitutive of Biblical hermeneutics, since "it posits the Bible as the site of method … and method is a practice of reading" (2). Hermeneutics, in turn, cannot be separated from politics, because "reading is … a political act, a determining choice that governs and informs the organization of the social" (3).

The connection Doueihi sees between election, hermeneutics, and politics defines the framework for his comparison of Augustine and Spinoza. While he notes that they share certain views -- both privilege the New Testament, for example, and take authentic religion to be universal and interior -- his main goal is to bring out "their radical differences" (4). Augustine and Spinoza, according to Doueihi, propose "fundamentally opposing conceptions" (ibid.). The theologian Augustine is above all an advocate of God's grace. The "visible mark of grace" is "obedience … to the demands of the divine will" to which "even reason is subject." And the "mirror image" of divine justice established through grace is "monarchic and theocratic power" -- the political implementation of God's rule (84). Given "the primacy of the theological in political matters," Augustine denies the possibility of a just non-Christian republic as laid out in Cicero's De republica (49). According to Doueihi, Augustine's "earthly city is a city of grace, with the justice and promise of grace" (50). The philosopher Spinoza, by contrast, is above all an advocate of "the human being's freedom to philosophize and his autonomy to exercise his political choices" (4). His political vision is "an enlightened republic founded on tolerance and philosophical conversation" (78). In a sense Spinoza is the heir of Cicero's republicanism for Doueihi (cp. 50-51).

The stark contrast between Augustine's and Spinoza's projects also accounts for their differing attitudes to superstition. Although both criticize superstition, Augustine's critique is confined to "pagan cults and gods" and "Jewish superstition" deriving from a literal understanding of the Law of Moses (4). These are replaced through a Christian theology of grace which incorporates the Law of Moses through allegorical interpretation. Spinoza's critique, on the other hand, discards all historical religions as superstition and is thus directed against Christianity as well (cp. 63). As a consequence, Spinoza rejects allegorical interpretation in favor of "literalism" with the aim to "demonstrate the geographical and political specificity" of Scripture and to contrast it with "the universality … of his religion" -- i.e., the philosopher's religion of reason (5).

The link to the supposedly crucial concept of election comes down to this: whereas "Augustine contests election in order to recuperate it in the Incarnation through grace," Spinoza "inserts election into a historical and political context, generalizing and naturalizing it with the aim of legitimating the freedom to philosophize" (77-78).

Doueihi tells his story in a long chapter on Augustine and a much shorter chapter on Spinoza with cameo appearances by Hobbes, the medieval Jewish poet and theologian Judah Halevi, and Pascal who serve different subordinate purposes. His discussion of Hobbes aims to show that "the question of biblical election" is still alive in the early modern period (58). Doueihi attributes to Halevi "a summation of what election is from the orthodox [Jewish] point of view" (69), i.e., the concept of election to which he thinks Spinoza is responding. Pascal, finally, provides a contrast of sorts to Spinoza because he takes the Hebrew Bible to be a witness to the truth of Christianity (cp. 78-83). Let me note in passing that the choice of Halevi as the representative of the "orthodox" Jewish view of election is particularly unfortunate. Halevi proposes a racist interpretation of election according to which Jews differ from non-Jews as much as human beings differ from animals. As Shlomo Pines showed in a classical paper, this view is not derived from the Bible or rabbinical literature but adapts the concept of the imâm -- the religious leader as conceived by the Ismâ'ilis, a branch of shî'ite Islam -- to a polemical defense of Judaism.[2] Spinoza never mentions Halevi nor discusses his racist views.

Doueihi copiously quotes from the authors he discusses -- indeed, in a sense his argument is a chain of quotations, linked by more or less accurate interpretative paraphrases. And yet the narrative is not developed through a careful reading of Augustine and Spinoza. Rather, the quotations are selected to fill out a preconceived narrative. This narrative, whose main points I outlined above, is not defensible in my view. I agree with Doueihi that neither Augustine nor Spinoza could accept the traditional Jewish concept of election. But I do not agree with much more.

On the most fundamental level I wonder why the Jewish concept of election should be the best entry point for a discussion of Augustine and Spinoza, rather than substantive philosophical concerns such as God, the problem of evil, the human will, etc. Spinoza surely followed the debate about free will and predestination, for example, raging among the various Reformation camps in the Netherlands, all of which could appeal to Augustine's authority because he changed his mind on this question. At stake here are, in fact, competing interpretations of Augustine's concept of election, and it is hard to imagine that Spinoza did not see his views on God, determinism, and salvation as intervening in this debate.

Although Doueihi does not justify his peculiar choice of themes, I suspect it follows from the crude dichotomy of theology and philosophy underlying his narrative. If this dichotomy holds, it would be impossible for Spinoza to engage Augustinian views in a philosophically serious way. With respect to Augustine, however, this dichotomy is clearly anachronistic. And it fails to adequately capture Spinoza's position as well. Consider, for example, Augustine's claim that faith is a necessary step toward wisdom. This claim is, in fact, a philosophical thesis: we cannot live a rationally ordered life without wisdom, he argues in On the Usefulness of Believing, and we cannot attain wisdom without living a rationally ordered life. To break this vicious circle we must start out by accepting the rules of reason on faith, i.e., on the authority of someone who is already wise. There is no evidence that for the Augustine of the late 380s and early 390s the Christian wisdom that eventually replaces faith differs in intellectual content from what he takes to be Platonic philosophy. The doctrines of grace and predestination of the later Augustine, and the voluntaristic concept of God to which they are tied, do, of course, break with Platonism. But breaking with Platonism does not mean breaking with philosophy and the reasons that led Augustine to adopt his later positions require careful examination.

The portrait of Spinoza as a precursor of the radical Enlightenment fits with a by now well-established (though in my view wrong) line of interpretation. Doueihi, however, turns this interpretation into a caricature. Although Alexandre Matheron's important study, Le Christ et le salut des ignorants chez Spinoza, is listed in the bibliography, Doueihi simply takes for granted that Spinoza is a critic of Christianity. But the TTP opens with an epigraph from the New Testament (1 John 4:13), presents Christ as the embodiment of superhuman wisdom (TTP 1), identifies the core of both the Hebrew Bible and the New Testament with the true word of God ("to love God above all and one's neighbor as oneself"; TTP 12), deduces the seven dogmas of the "universal religion" from obedience to God (TTP 14), and assigns a vital role to theology in ensuring obedience (TTP 15) -- to mention only the most salient points one would have expected Doueihi to address. There is a broad spectrum of interpretations of the "Christian" Spinoza. They range from Leo Strauss, who thinks Spinoza is bluffing to protect society from his subversive philosophy and himself from persecution by the religious mob, to Graeme Hunter, who argues that Spinoza is committed to a version of radical Protestantism.[3] Doueihi simply ignores all of them.

But even he cannot disregard entirely Spinoza's Christ and religio catholica. His solution is to argue them away: Spinoza's "Christ is a figure outside religions" who "anticipates Nietzsche's in the Antichrist" (77). And the religio catholica is Spinoza's "invention of a creed in two parts" -- a religious part consisting in dogmas that he rejects and a philosophical part expressing his endorsement of the libertas philosophandi (ibid.). Neither claim has a basis in Spinoza. Consider, for example, the question whether justification through works is possible -- a crucial question in the debate about free will and predestination I mentioned above. According to the later Augustine justification is only possible through grace, a view first stated in 396 in the form of an interpretation of Paul's Epistle to the Romans in the Questions to Simplician. Spinoza, to be sure, rejects Augustine's doctrine of grace. But he would argue that Augustine misunderstood Paul on this matter: when Paul says that justification depends on faith, not on works, he means that "consent of the mind," not "fear of the gallows" is the right motivation for doing what the law prescribes (TTP 4). In other words: what we have here is not a disagreement between the philosopher and the Christian theologian but two competing interpretations of St. Paul. And Spinoza nowhere says that he has invented a creed in two parts. What he does say is that the seven dogmas of the religio catholica are entailed in obedience to God, and that they are general and simple enough to be acceptable constraints on the libertas philosophandi (cp. TTP 14).

Turning to the framework of Doueihi's comparison of Augustine and Spinoza, the connection he suggests between election, hermeneutics, and politics is not plausible in my view. There is no evidence that Augustine's reading of Scripture is primarily motivated by a concern with election. There is, on the other hand, a great deal of evidence that it is motivated by his rupture with Manichaeism and the need to respond to the Manichean charge that the God of the Bible is anthropomorphic and the creator of evil (see his Commentary on Genesis against the Manicheans). In this context he adopts the method of allegorical interpretation from Ambrose, the bishop of Milan, who baptized him in 387. And Spinoza's discussion of election in TTP 3 is, as far as I can see, neither motivated by the historical-critical method nor gives rise to it. The Jews cannot be God's chosen people because Deus sive Natura does not choose (as he does not perform miracles if these are understood as divine interventions in the causal order of nature -- see TTP 6). The argument is grounded in Spinoza's metaphysics, not his exegesis.

Returning to Augustine, the connection between hermeneutics and politics Doueihi suggests is not obvious either. Sure, he denies that a community can be truly just without God's grace. But this has no direct implications for the form of government of the "earthly city." It clearly does not turn Augustine into an advocate of theocracy or monarchy. The only perfectly just city is the "city of God" in which God's rule and true freedom coincide. Whether the "earthly city" is a democracy, an aristocracy, or a monarchy is not relevant at all. Precisely because the city of God is distinct from the earthly city and does not interfere with its political order, some scholars argue that Augustine is a precursor of the modern separation of church and state. He certainly comes closer to it than Spinoza who argues that "the right over matters of religion" must be "vested entirely in the sovereign" (TTP 19). In Spinoza, on the other hand, there is a more obvious connection between hermeneutics and politics, since the historico-critical interpretation of the Bible aims, among others, at curbing the political ambitions of the Calvinist Church. There is even a link to his discussion of election, although one that further undermines Doueihi's case. As Michael Rosenthal has convincingly argued, Spinoza's account of the rise and fall of the Hebrew state in TTP 17 is meant to offer a model to the Dutch who saw themselves as the new chosen people. Taking them at their word, Spinoza is exhorting them to pay attention to how Moses ensured the state's stability and peace by separating the interpretation of the law from its political enforcement. Spinoza's implicit message is: let the Calvinist preachers interpret the law, but do not give them political power! If Rosenthal is right, Spinoza would not be criticizing the political order established through the election of the Hebrews, but commending it to the Dutch for imitation.[4]

Has Doueihi attained his goal of writing a book that in Nietzsche's sense is "both philological and untimely"? Not quite, I fear, if by "philological" he means a careful interpretation and comparison of Augustine and Spinoza. He did whet at least my appetite for further studies of Spinoza's relationship to Augustine and Augustinianism. At any rate, finding "untimely" guidance for the present and the future from thinkers of the past in my view requires more work to correctly understand them.

[1] See Stephen Menn's excellent book on Descartes and Augustine, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.

[2] Shlomo Pines, "Shî'ite Terms and Conceptions in Judah Halevi's Kuzari," Jerusalem Studies in Arabic and Islam 2 (1980), 165-251.

[3] Leo Strauss, "How to Study Spinoza's Theologico-Political Treatise," in: Strauss, Persecution and the Art of Writing, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988, 142-201; Graeme Hunter, Radical Protestantism in Spinoza's Thought, Aldershot: Ashgate, 2005.

[4] Michael Rosenthal, "Why Spinoza Chose the Hebrews: The Exemplary Function of Prophecy in the Theological-Political Treatise," in History of Political Thought 18 (1997), 207-241.