Augustine's Confessions: Philosophy in Autobiography

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William E. Mann (ed.), Augustine's Confessions: Philosophy in Autobiography, Oxford University Press, 2014, 223pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199577552.

Reviewed by John Rist, The Catholic University of America


This is an unusually philosophical — thus very welcome — book about the Confessions. Its aim is to break new ground, and as is normal with such exploration some of the earth turns out to be stony — though in this case the great mass is fertile. For it is surprising (at first sight) if after so many ‘Augustinian’ centuries much new philosophical territory remains to be explored in Augustine’s work, let alone in the Confessions. But that misjudgement arises in no small part from restrictive or reductionist ideas about what counts as philosophical enquiry. Certainly the Confessions is hardly a philosophical textbook, or even a philosophical treatise, but William E. Mann’s subtitle Philosophy in Autobiography sets the record straight, even if some of the later books of the Confessions are only in a strange, if appropriate, sense to be dubbed ‘autobiographical’.

In the opening essay Peter King argues that Augustinian ascent differs radically from that deriving ultimately from Plato’s Symposium. The two are entirely different enterprises (25) in that whereas Plato considers the ascent to be ‘an erotic enterprise through and through’ (7), for Augustine an inability to control his sexual urges led him to follow Ambrose and others in radically separating ‘carnal’ desires from the desire for God. There are obvious difficulties with this: that Augustine’s attitude to sexuality is very different from that of Ambrose’s Philo-style exegesis; that King’s contrasting account of Plato and Augustine seems to rely on a very restricted (and non-Augustinian) account of what Augustine thinks sexuality is; that it ignores the frequent comparisons by Augustine outside the Confessions of desires for sexual union (even with a prostitute) with the (sublimated but still erotic) longing for God; that even though Augustine regarded perverse (Conf. 8.10) sexuality as his own peculiar problem, he made no such assumptions about others: thus the problem with his friend Alypius was not sex but the excitement of gladiatorial killings. Indeed one might argue that at least in his language Augustine has explicitly ‘resexualized’ the desire for God when compared with his immediate source for Platonic eroticism, the writings of Plotinus. King thus seems to draw the wrong conclusions from his recognition that Augustine differs from the pagans in that he believes he needs God’s immediate help to achieve the ascent.

Tomas Ekenberg’s contribution concerns the relationship between practical reasoning and the ‘wills’ in Confessions 8, but though of interest it is vitiated by a long-standing misinterpretation of Augustine’s account of voluntas — the relationship of voluntas to love being ignored — as well as of the relationship between voluntas and arbitrium. For though Ekenberg’s essay is informed by Michael Frede’s (over)-insistence on Augustine’s Stoicism, the important recent work of Sarah Byers is conspicuously absent from a discussion too focussed, as so often, on the rights and wrongs of the now discredited claims of Abrecht Dihle. But there are some interesting comments on what is in effect the difference between reasoning, post-lapsarian rationalizing and a divided or multiple ‘will’ in Ekenberg’s account of how Augustine understands ‘doing things for a reason’ (35-36).

The next two essays — by Nicholas Wolterstorff and Stephen Menn — concern the transitional book 10, the vital hinge between the more autobiographical books 1-9 and the commentary on Genesis that follows. Wolterstorff, claiming that Augustine ‘breaks with eudaimonism’, opens with some general comments on how Greeks and Romans understood ‘happiness’ or ‘the estimable life’, which is normally seen as active rather than passive, as what one does rather than as how one reacts to what happens to one. Augustine, too, talks about our longing for ‘happiness’ (as in CD 10.21) and for ‘true joy’, though, pace Wolterstorff (52), although he associates ‘true joy’ with happiness he does not identify them (any more than does Aristotle in NE 10). So I would dispute Wolterstorff’s claim that in this respect Augustine understood ‘happiness’ as ‘much closer to what we today mean by the term’ (53).

More interesting is Wolterstorff’s thoughtful analysis of how Augustine understood ‘true joy’, a joy that must be enduring and unalloyed (54). And that enquiry involves inspecting what Augustine meant by misery — including what Wolterstorff dubs ‘empathic misery’ (that sadness of a good Christian not only at his own ungodliness but at the ungodliness of others (68), which seems to arise from unsatisfied desires and excessive attachment to the transitory rather than to the unchanging). For conversion had failed (and should fail, since ‘there are times when we must welcome sorrow’ (3.2)) to extirpate Augustine’s misery — and thus from a Stoic point of view really is a failure — since it also made him aware that in this life such ‘freedom’ is out of reach: not only is it hard to be free of misery if our basic desires, say for food and shelter, are frustrated, but sinful temptations are too strong for us. We cannot rid ourselves of the desire for sensory pleasures for their own sake; or of the desire for praise; or of curiositas, which may be understood either as wanting to know what one should not know or — more significantly — as a self-indulgent attention to trivia (however defined), which distracts us from prayer and the love of God (cf. 10.35). In sum, Augustine complains that his habits induce him to look at the world without all the time seeing things in Deo, thus failing to recognize God as all in all: which entails, as Wolterstorff says, that true joy is not possible in this life (69).

None of this suggests an abandonment of eudaimonism, as Wolterstorff seems to suppose, but merely that the pagans were mistaken in supposing it to be available in the present life. And Wolterstorff seems to misread Augustine’s problem about being fascinated by seeing a lizard catch flies. It is a general principal of ancient ethics that pleasure, even if good, should not be pursued directly (though they rarely attempt to explain why I should not just buy an ice cream on a hot day simply because I enjoy ice creams). Certainly Augustine knows that he does not plan to enjoy the activity of the lizard, but the true lesson of the passage is that (like the ancients more generally) he saw the virtues too exclusively (as Wolterstorff knows) in terms of action, which entails too little attention to what happens when we are confronted with the activity of others — like lizards — and when things are (as Augustine says of dreams) done in (or to) us. For some virtues, it would seem, depend not on our being actors but on our being patients. Heroic behaviour can be the mark of the patient in the cancer ward.

Menn writes about methodology, but goes beyond the merely methodological: his rich paper shows how Augustine uses aporiai (especially something like Meno’s paradox) to argue in book ten how we can both search for God without knowing him and at the same time recognize him when we find him. The technique, though not the language, resembles Plato’s, Plato speaking of advancing from true opinion, while Augustine calls his starting point ‘faith’. Plato explains how we can learn how to get from Athens to Larissa by following the good advice of someone who has made the journey, while Augustine relies on those who can speak of God and of human psychology authoritatively, being especially interested in how, before knowing God, we can have intentional attitudes towards him. And that aporia leads Menn first to Augustine’s analysis of memory, not least of how we can remember our previous experience of forgetting, and beyond that to how everyone prefers the joy of truth to any corresponding joy without truth — and truth (as argued in book seven and elsewhere) is God (91). Yet, though we are created as lovers of the truth, we also resist the truth, and the final part of Menn’s paper thus connects with that of Wolterstorff: though we instinctively love the truth, our carnal desires (in a broad sense of ‘carnal’) and the temptations that derive from them — intellectual as well as physical: the triple concupiscence (10.41) — pull us away. And Menn offers some very helpful comment on the nature and range of curiositas itself, in particular on our temptation (not least in matters of religion) to ‘fabulate’: to spend our time constructing some sort of pseudo-universe instead of the one God has given us, this being a particularly common example of our wish to appropriate God’s uniquely creative role.

In recent years there has been much useful discussion of Augustine’s attitude to dreams, and Mann, a distinguished contributor to this debate, now develops his ideas further in a wide-ranging paper on dreams and drama in the Confessions. In broad terms his subject is Augustine’s account of imagination. He starts with the well-known problem of why we go to the theatre to be made sad; that is, why in some sense we like to be made sad. Following contemporary discussion, Mann develops for Augustine the notion of quasi-emotions, quasi-beliefs, quasi-consent, etc., one difference between a quasi-emotion (which we feel when watching a stage-murder) and the emotion we would feel seeing a killing on the street being that quasi-emotions do not (at least immediately) trigger action.

From quasi-emotions and experiences in the theatre Mann moves on to Augustine’s dream experiences, especially his erotic dreams. Augustine tells us that such dreams are ‘done in him’, but he still hesitates as to whether in giving quasi-consent to immoral actions in a dream he is really guilty of immoral behaviour. In considering Augustine’s account, Mann points to two possible explanations as to how dream experiences are different from experiences (and consequent decisions) in the ‘real’ world. He dubs these the ‘No Action Thesis’ (this referring to one of the marks of the behaviour of theatre-goers) and the Character/Action Thesis (120), which indicates that our dreams tell us what sort of people we are ‘underneath’; that is, raising the question of why we have apparently immoral dreams. Mann wants to know whether Augustine can exonerate himself from the charge of being immoral in his dreams, but it would appear that for Augustine the answer is simple. If he dreams ‘immorally’, it is because he has developed immoral habits; before the fall, Adam would have had no immoral dreams. But in this world — to co-operate with Plato a bit — ‘the good man dreams what the bad man does’, except that Augustine’s emphasis is on the fact that there are no men good enough not to dream what the bad man does!

In recent years we have learned a lot more about Augustine’s fascinating theories of time (not least from Therese Scarpelli Cory’s essay in Vivarium 2012). When we turn to Paul Helm’s paper ‘Thinking Eternally’, we continue that learning process, studying the contrast between our temporal environment and the atemporal activity of God. Helm outlines two current accounts of the temporal series, now regularly labelled the A-series (captured by indexicals — ‘now’ ‘yesterday’, etc., and understood from the point of view of an individual in time) and the B-series (viewed ‘from nowhere’ — or for some ‘scientifically’ — and deploying only three temporal relations (‘earlier than’, ‘later than’ and ‘simultaneously’). According to many modern writers the B-series captures the true nature of time while the A-series is essential for carrying on our own day-by-day activities. Helm argues that Augustine is aware of something like both series: he understands the necessity of the A-series if we are to regulate and order our daily human lives — though we view the past and future as present to our minds (‘presentism’); he identifies something like the B-series not as a view from nowhere but as indicating the viewpoint and activity of God as creator and lord of time itself. Thus, for God, all times of the universe are eternally present, but not temporally present, not, that is, known ‘simultaneously’; as for us created beings, we are bound within temporality (151).

Blake Dutton is concerned with the principles of Augustine’s biblical exegesis, arguing that Augustine defends the theory that any interpretation of the Old Testament is acceptable if it is orthodox, thus apparently making the test of acceptability not the author’s intention, but truth. Dutton explains this in the light of Augustine’s view that we cannot know the content of other people’s minds (including of course the mind of Moses and other biblical ‘authors’) and that therefore truth is the only reliable criterion. And in any case, if it is true, Moses intended it: an axiom, which Dutton calls the Plenitude of Meaning Thesis. But this approach seems open to several objections. First although it is true for Augustine that we cannot know our own minds or the minds of others — Augustine will tell us elsewhere that he cannot know what he will be like tomorrow — he would hardly deny that he can have a fair measure of adequate belief about what he will be like when that next day dawns; he will not think it likely, for example, that tomorrow he will be a Donatist hit-man. And again since the tool that Dutton reveals as Augustine’s allows virtually anything to be read into any Old Testament text, so long as it is orthodox (177), we may wonder whether we need the biblical text at all. Unless, that is, we know that orthodoxy checks biblical interpretation because the Bible tells us what is orthodox! So contrary to the other essays, Dutton shows us something very problematic indeed in a particular area of Augustine’s activity! Augustine, of course, dismissed those of his Catholic opponents on this who were concerned with specific authorial intention as proud lovers of their own opinion (12.34, cf. 173). A nice move, but rhetorical rather than persuasive.

With the final essay, by Christian Tornau, we return to a more traditional and philological approach — in this case to Augustine’s exegesis of Genesis — though Tornau notes that in the Confessions, but not elsewhere, exegesis is closely linked to Augustine’s personal pilgrimage in grace, not least to the intellectual aspects of that pilgrimage. Hence he is as much concerned to show Augustine’s radical reformulation and correction of Plotinian ideas as to accept his important dependence on Plotinus and the Platonic tradition more generally. In interpreting the first verse of Genesis, Augustine (as has often been recognized) understands ‘heaven’ and ‘earth’ as indicating the intelligible and sensible worlds respectively, in this respect proposing a Christianized version of Plotinus’ account of the ‘creation’ of the Divine Mind from the One.

Tornau prefaces his discussion with a useful summary of earlier platonizing thought — both Christian and pagan — about intelligible matter, and indeed of the origin of matter in general, emphasizing that a key feature of Augustine’s own account is a unique emphasis on mutability (hence potentiality) as a primary feature of all matter, even the intelligible variety.

So overall Mann has edited a spicy mixed bag, with a few lows and some exhilarating highs.