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Gareth Matthews, Augustine, Blackwell, 2005, 148pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0631233474.

Reviewed by Sarah Byers, P.I.M.S. Toronto and Ave Maria University


This is the second book (appearing in the same year as Allen Wood's Kant) in the Blackwell Great Minds series, which has two advertised goals: to give readers a strong sense of the fundamental views of the great western philosophers, and to capture the relevance of these philosophers to the way we think and live today. Clearly, these are both laudable goals, as is Matthews' own more particular goal of contributing to a wider recognition of Augustine's importance as a philosopher (6).

Matthews succeeds in achieving his particular goal by making Augustine a dialogue partner with other important philosophers. The book presents an interesting array of topics treated by Augustine[1] -- sometimes using commonly overlooked texts such as the Literal Meaning of Genesis, the Incomplete Commentary on the Literal Meaning of Genesis, and the Sermons -- which it links to similar discussions from the history of philosophy and contemporary philosophy. With this topical and chronological range, Matthews shows that philosophers and students working in epistemology, ethics, metaphysics, logic, philosophy of language, philosophical anthropology, or philosophy of religion, and focusing on any one of a number of authors from Xenophanes to Hintikka, will be compelled to admit that Augustine's philosophical work is sometimes related to their own, and that consequently, comprehensive knowledge of their subject area will require some familiarity with Augustine.

Arguably, the book also does a good job of presenting the material in a manner appropriate to "the way we live today," in the sense of 'the way we educate and learn today.' It can evoke the (sometimes exciting) classroom experience[2] of an introduction to Augustine for smart students whose background in philosophy has been topically oriented, who are largely unfamiliar with the primary texts, and whose attention span is best served by switching topics frequently. (Thus, e.g., there are fifteen chapters of about nine pages each, and most of chapter two is devoted to a recapitulation of Augustine's life as recounted in the Confessions, apparently offered in lieu of the Confessions themselves.) To the extent that this student profile describes a typical kind of college student in the U.S., the book could be a palatable way to give many people a first exposure to Augustine, and thereby perform a valuable service. Professors trained as specialists in ancient or late ancient philosophy, in particular, may find the volume a helpful resource for introducing variety into their teaching material.

Let us now consider the book's content: its communication of Augustine's fundamental views and of their relevance for contemporary thought.

Sometimes the volume offers illuminating comparisons to contemporary material which is genuinely complementary to Augustine's work. Perhaps the best example is the discussion of time in chapter nine. Here Matthews explicates John McTaggart's much-discussed[3] 1908 distinction between "A-series" time (involving tensed terms which depend upon a perceiver's 'location' in a timeline, such as "past," "present," and "future") and "B-series" time (in which events are "prior to," "simultaneous with," or "posterior to" other events, without reference to the perspective of someone inside the timeline).[4] He rightly compares this to Augustine's talk, on the one hand, of extended time as 'lived' time (the past and future exist only in our minds: Confessions 11.16.21, 11.18.23, 11.20.26), and his talk, on the other hand, of 'objective' time, that is, his use of a standard ancient definition according to which time is that by which we measure changes (e.g. the Literal Meaning of Genesis 5.5.12, Confessions 11.22.30). The comparison is a useful way to make Augustine's theses explicit and susceptible to analysis.

Yet how far does the similarity to McTaggart extend? According to McTaggart's idealism, change within the B-series depends ontologically upon the A-series, and the B-series is not real in itself.[5] Does Augustine agree? On page 82 we are given to understand that, because Augustine holds that "the only place where periods of time exist is in the mind," he also holds that "time is the measure of something mental" (emphasis added). Chapter nine continues: Augustine "can understand the B-series time line as a human construction, something each of us can make for ourselves" (83); and "from this perspective [sc. that of the A-series perspective of Confessions 11], the objective timeline is what we might call 'a well-founded fiction,' a fiction constructed in the mind of the individual thinker" (84). "'Real' time, that is, human time, is something we put together mentally" (83).

Matthews is here in prestigious company. Russell offered a similar interpretation of Augustine (though without the use of McTaggart).[6] Yet Russell acknowledged that he lacked a specialist's understanding of Augustine, who was "better known to some others" than to himself.[7] Wetzel subsequently pointed out that it is difficult to square Russell's interpretation with Augustine's actual words, e.g. in 11.20.26.[8] I, too, have trouble agreeing with this kind of interpretation. Augustine says that the medium in which extensions of time subsist is the mind (11.27.36). It does not follow necessarily that he believes that time measures merely mental objects; and in fact, he plainly asserts that by time we measure changes in extra-mental objects (e.g. "time enables us to measure the motions of bodies and to say that, for example, this movement requires twice as long as that," 11.23.30, emphasis added). He also indicates that (B-series) time passes whether or not we attend to its passing. One simply cannot help being "in" it, and thus may find upon awakening from a reverie of philosophical musing that it has elapsed (e.g. 11.25.32: "I still do not know what time is, and … as I say this I know that I am in time and have been talking about time for a long time"). In general, the text of Confessions 11 gives the impression that awareness of the passage of B-series time constitutes A-series time, and thus that the A-series is non-reciprocally dependent on the B-series (see e.g. 11.17.22, 11.20.26). Nevertheless, Matthews' comparison remains helpful because it suggests interesting lines of inquiry. The position of Augustine is both similar to and different from contemporary tensed and tenseless theories of time; and tracing these out in some detail is a worthwhile project.

This same chapter deals with Augustine on creation, a topic that has received some attention in philosophy of religion circles. Owing to its contemporary relevance, the evolutionary theory Augustine sketches in the Literal Meaning of Genesis attracted the notice of van Inwagen, for instance.[9] The account offered in that text also resonates provocatively with the Big Bang theory. (Augustine argues that the "six days" are not periods of time, but that God created everything at once (simul omnia facta sunt) in one "blow" of establishing the universe (in ictu condendi, 4.33.51); what he actually created was matter having 'seed-forms,' i.e. having potency to yield the species that actually emerged later (e.g. seminaliter, 4.33.51; fecit [Creator] quae futura essent, 4.35.56; potentialiter, 5.5.14; 5.5.15-16).) Some of the main features of this account are mentioned again in the City of God (11.7, 11.30), though not with the same clarity or detail.

This book does not mention that account. Doubtless Matthews had his reasons for omitting it, and it would have been interesting to know what they were. Perhaps one reason was that the problem which interests him on pages 78-9 seems to arise only when the Literal Meaning account is excluded. Using City of God 12.16, Matthews posits angelic thoughts, changing from the first moment of creation, in order to save Augustine's assertion that time began with creation: "given his [i.e. Augustine's] assumption that motion is a precondition for time, he could not think there was a time when that angel existed motionless, that is, thoughtless" (79). However, if we say with Augustine in the Literal Meaning that God (also) created matter at the beginning of time, then there is no need to use the angels to account for change. Moreover, if we do this then it becomes clear that Augustine includes the angels primarily for exegetical reasons, not philosophical ones. He introduces them (intelligences, i.e. 'intellectual light'), in order to explain why Genesis speaks of "light," "morning," and "evening" prior to the creation of the sun[10] (Literal Meaning 4.22.39; cf. City of God 11.7, 11.9, and, though mentioned only very briefly, the early part of 12.16 itself).[11] The account of angels as the first creatures therefore seems most pertinent to chapter ten ("Faith and Reason"), which concerns the Augustinian method "faith in search of understanding." However, it is notoriously difficult to disentangle Augustine's philosophical projects from his theological ones (and some might argue that in certain cases, it is not even advisable). More generally, it is to this book's credit that it does not exclude all mention of angels from squeamishness or embarrassment. As Harm Goris has recently pointed out, that kind of reaction is counterproductive given the importance of angelology for understanding other areas of medieval metaphysics;[12] and Augustine's other views about angels (that they exist and have a certain nature) depend no less on Middle Platonism than they do on scripture.

Augustine as a 'philosopher of interiority' continues to provoke discussion,[13] and Matthews is right to think that there is more to be said on the matter. He devotes five chapters to exploring the ways that Augustine's positions in the Confessions, Against the Academicians, On Free Choice, and On the Trinity are like and unlike Descartes'.[14] The Confessions as a whole are "actually a 'self-revelation'," despite being in the form of a prayer addressed to God (5) -- apparently they are along the lines of Descartes' conversation with himself about his thoughts.[15] A "most fascinating passage" of Against the Academicians is one which "introduces what, in modern philosophy, is called 'the Problem of the External World' … Augustine is introducing here, for the first time in Western Philosophy, the idea of one's own phenomenal world" (19-20), but "he does not recognize the Problem of the External World, let alone try to solve it" (23). "There is, in fact, a dim foreshadowing of Descartes' project in Book 2 of On Free Choice of the Will… . One has to admit, however, that Augustine's reconstruction project … is nowhere nearly as systematic, ambitious, or compelling as Descartes' project in his Meditations" (36); Augustine "call[s] attention to an inner realm of knowledge each of us has open to us… But in no way does he suppose that this realm of inner knowledge is the foundation for all that we know" (42). Elsewhere we hear that, "the explanation Augustine offers [of how we can know that there are rational souls in addition to our own] is, so far as I know, the first statement of what has come to be called 'the argument from analogy for other minds'," (49) but "Augustine is not interested in discussing solipsism. He supposes, without offering any arguments to support the position, that there exists a world quite independently of him" (55).

Fresh texts might shed additional light on the question of Augustine's resemblance to Descartes. In one of the sermons discovered by Dolbeau in 1990, for instance, we find:

humans cannot turn over good things in their minds, unless they have perceived them through the senses of the body … for you cannot, oh human being, think about a good thing, except such as you have been in the habit of seeing or hearing or encountering with some such sense. Whatever has not entered through a sense of your body, also cannot be thought about by your mind (Quidquid non intravit per sensum corporis tui, non potest et cogitari animo tuo).[16]

If Dolbeau is right, then this sermon is authentic.[17] The last sentence of the quote evokes the scholastic tag, "There is nothing in the mind which was not first in the senses" (nihil in intellectu quod prius non fuerit in sensu).[18] Augustine knew the claim from the Stoic account of concept-formation, as transmitted by Cicero.[19] Descartes' epistemology was based on a rejection of this claim.[20] Thus, an interesting line of research would be to track textually, and to think through, Augustine's joint commitment to the claim and to the so-called "illumination doctrine." Matthews is more accurate on the latter than a number of other secondary treatments when he describes it as a version of the Platonic theory of innate ideas (59). Yet at times the book could be clearer about the fact that, after Augustine's early dalliance with and repudiation of scepticism (Against the Academics 3.9.20; cf. Confessions 5.10.19, 6.4.6-6.5.7), his epistemology was a classical realism forged from Stoicism as well as Platonism (see e.g. the accounts of sensory cognition in the Literal Meaning of Genesis 9.14.25 with On the Trinity 9.16, 10.7, 11.2).

In sum, we are all indebted to Matthews for continuing to draw attention to Augustine's philosophical range and relevance. In my view, this volume will be helpful primarily as a teaching resource for scholars already grounded in the history of philosophy. It is possible that an untutored neophyte could form a misleading impression about some one of Augustine's fundamental views, in addition to taking away the good things that are to be found in it; but in the hands of a professor with suitable background knowledge, it will be an effective way to pass on Matthews' well-founded enthusiasm for Augustine.

[1] The topics are: scepticism, language, immateriality of the soul, epistemology from a first-person point of view, moral responsibility for dream-contents, time and creation, the relationship between faith and reason, the problem of foreknowledge and free will, the problem of evil, the problem of how it is possible to choose moral evil, lying, and the nature of happiness.

[2] Thus Ch. 14, "Lying," contains a description of the way that Matthews teaches the topic, and student responses (126-7).

[3] See e.g. the essays and references in Questions of Time and Tense, ed. R. Le Poidevin (Oxford: Clarendon, 1998), and for a detailed review of the literature, S. Richter, The Reality of Tense (Hamburg: Hamburg University Press, 2004).

[4] J. McTaggart, "The Unreality of Time," Mind 17 (1908): 457-74, reprinted in J. McTaggart, The Nature of Existence (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1927) Vol. II, Ch. 33.

[5] See McTaggart contrasting his view with that of Russell: Nature, Vol. II, Ch. 33, sections 310-311, 315, 317, 347-350. (McTaggart ultimately asserts that both the B-series and the A-series are unreal, positing instead a C-series, which is non-temporal, but appears temporal under some conditions.)

[6] B. Russell, Human Knowledge: Its Scope and Limits (New York: Simon and Schuster, 1948), 212; idem, History of Western Philosophy. Second Edition (London: Routledge, 1961), 352-3 (original edition 1946). Matthews mentions Sorabji (85); and Kirwan could have been cited as well. See R. Sorabji, Time, Creation and the Continuum (Ithaca/London: Cornell University Press, 1983), 30-1; C. Kirwan, Augustine (London/New York: Routledge, 1989), 185. It should be noted that the interpretations of these latter two authors do not agree on all points with one another, with Russell, or with Matthews.

[7] Russell, History, 7.

[8] J. Wetzel, "Time After Augustine," Religious Studies 31/3 (1995): 341-57; see 348.

[9] P. van Inwagen, "Genesis and Evolution" in Reasoned Faith, ed. E. Stump (Ithaca/London: Cornell University Press, 1993), 93-127.

[10] Gen. 1:3-13 (the first three "days").

[11] Also in City 12.16, when supposing that material creation began subsequent to the initial moment of time, Augustine uses angels for another exegetical purpose: they can explain how God is "lord" over subjects from the beginning of time. He is apparently trying to save Ps. 144:3 and/or Sirach 1:8. (The former: "Regnum tuum regnum omnium saeculorum et potestas tua in omni generatione et generatione." The latter: "Unus est Altissimus creator omnipotens rex potens et metuendus nimis sedens super thronam illius et dominans.")

[12] He mentions anthropology and philosophy of God, owing to the fact that angels are between humans and God in the medieval hierarchy of being. See H. Goris, "The Angelic Doctor and Angelic Speech: The Development of Thomas Aquinas' Thought on How Angels Communicate," Medieval Philosophy and Theology 11 (2003): 87-105; see 88f. This article tracks Aquinas' use of Augustine as well as Aristotle.

[13] See e.g. J. Cavadini, "Reconsidering 'The Self' in Augustine's Thought," forthcoming in Augustinian Studies (proceedings of the 2006 'Reconsiderations II' conference), R. Sorabji, Self (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2006), 212-229; P. Cary, Augustine's Invention of the Inner Self (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000).

[14] Ch. 1 ("The First-Person Point of View"), Ch. 3 ("Skepticism"), Ch. 5 ("The Augustinian Cogito"), Ch. 6 ("Mind-Body Dualism"), Ch. 7 ("The Problem of Other Minds").

[15] Discourse on Method 2; CSM III 116/AT VI 11.

[16] Augustine is glossing 1 Cor. 2:9 ("Eye has not seen, nor ear heard, neither has it entered into the heart of man, what things God has prepared for those who love him"). Dolbeau Sermon 25 (=360B Maurist), paragraph 2: "… homines animis bona volvere non possunt, nisi quae corporeis sensibus perceperunt … Non enim, homo, cogitare bonum potes, nisi quale videre vel audire vel tali aliquot sensu contingere consuesti. Quidquid non intravit per sensum corporis tui, non potest et cogitari animo tuo." See Vingt-six Sermons au Peuple d'Afrique, ed. F. Dolbeau (Paris: Institut d'√Čtudes Augustiniennes, 1996), 249. Trans. adapted from E. Hill, Sermons. The Works of Saint Augustine III/11 (Hyde Park, NY: New City Press, 1997), 367.

[17] I happen to think that this sermon contains a short interpolation by a later medieval scribe (see a forthcoming "note" to that effect); but the content of the sound portion supports the present point.

[18] See e.g. Eustachio a Sancto Paulo (an author of philosophical handbooks known to Descartes), Sum. Phil. III, 427-9, cited in E. Gilson, Index Scolastico-Cartésien (New York: Burt Franklin, 1912), 203-4.

[19] Acad. 2.7.19-22.

[20] His scholastic education had attributed it to Aristotle, of course. For Descartes' explicit use of the phrase to describe what he used to think before doubting his scholastic education, see Med. VI, CSM II 52/AT VII 75: "facile mihi persuadebam nullam plane me habere in intellectu, quam non prius habuissem in sensu."