Austere Realism: Contextual Semantics Meets Minimal Ontology

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Terence E. Horgan and Matjaž Potrč, Austere Realism: Contextual Semantics Meets Minimal Ontology, MIT Press, 2008, 219pp., $32.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262083768.

Reviewed by Daniel Z. Korman, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


You could say that Horgan and Potrč aren't big on commitment. As they would have it, an ordinary utterance of 'there is a brown chair in the corner' is strictly and literally true, and yet there are no such things as chairs or corners, nor is there any such thing as being brown. Their project in Austere Realism is to supply a semantic framework in which this and other such sentences of ordinary discourse (as well as scientific discourse) are unambiguously true, despite the fact that the sorts of items that would ordinarily be taken to answer to their quantifiers, referring expressions, and predicates do not exist. The conciliatory strategy that they develop is designed to be compatible with a variety of different austere ontologies, though they ultimately come down in favor of a monist ontology on which there exists exactly one concrete particular: "the blobject," that is, the whole cosmos. Although I cannot hope to do justice to all of the intricacies of their ontological-cum-semantic theory in this review, I will do my best to touch on all of the main themes of the book, and I will try to indicate why I was not persuaded.

Austere Realism begins with an attack on "naive commonsensical ontologies," that is, those that include more or less all of those material objects that we ordinarily take to exist. Horgan and Potrč rest their case against naive commonsensical ontologies on two arguments: an argument from generality (§2.3) and an argument from vagueness (§2.4). Their argument from generality runs as follows: The correct answer to the special composition question, 'under what conditions do some things compose something?', must be "general and systematic"; but there is no general and systematic answer to this question that accommodates the bulk of our ordinary judgments about when composition does and does not occur; so a great many of our ordinary judgments must be incorrect.

Anyone who has tried to give even a rough-and-ready answer to the special composition question that accommodates our ordinary judgments will feel the force of the second premise of this argument. But why accept the first premise? What is meant to be objectionable about the unavailability of a general and systematic answer? Horgan and Potrč contend that if indeed the compositional facts do not conform to some such general answer, then they would have to be metaphysically basic (or "brute"), which surely they are not. It is far from obvious, however, that one who embraces the bruteness of composition -- that is, that there is no neat and tidy answer to the special composition question -- is thereby committed to the brutality of compositional facts -- that is, that facts about whether composition occurs are metaphysically basic.[1] Denying that there are interesting general principles governing the conditions under which composition occurs seems entirely compatible with maintaining that, in each case, there are noncompositional facts in virtue of which the compositional facts are as they are.

Perhaps there are principled reasons for thinking that there is no conceptual room for bruteness without the brutality of the associated facts, but any such reasons would cut equally against Horgan and Potrč, for they themselves make a structurally identical claim later in the book. For reasons having to do with their revisionary theory of truth (more on that below), they wind up endorsing a semantic particularist thesis on which there are no general and systematic answers to a certain range of questions about the semantic facts (§6.4). And yet they do not think that the nonsystematizable semantic facts are brute; rather, they are determined by nonsystematizable facts about the context and relevant mental states (§6.4.4, §7.4.3). They do defend their semantic particularism against various arguments (e.g., learnability arguments, §§6.4-5), but it would have been interesting to see at least some discussion of why they take the absence of relevant general principles to entail the bruteness of compositional facts but not of semantic facts.

Their argument from vagueness runs roughly as follows: In order for an object or property to be vague, it must exhibit "boundarylessness." Part of what is required for an object or property to exhibit boundarylessness is that there exist an associated sorites series beginning with a determinate F and ending with a determinate non-F in which adjacent cases always have exactly the same status -- for instance, if one case in the series is indeterminately determinately F, so must be both of its neighbors in the series. But (the argument continues) it is impossible that there be such a series. So any ontology that includes vague objects or properties ("slobjects") is untenable. This then serves as a kind of master argument, not only against naive commonsensical ontologies, but also against layered ontologies (e.g., Schaffer's priority monism, §5.4) and Lewis-style supervaluationist strategies for securing the existence of cats and the like (on the grounds that the property of belonging to every permissible interpretation of 'cat' is a vague property, §5.5). I leave it as an exercise for the reader (who doesn't have a 2500-word limit) to tackle this argument.

The core of their strategy for reconciling austere ontologies with ordinary discourse is their contention that truth is "semantic correctness under contextually operative semantic standards" (§3.3). In ordinary contexts, an utterance of 'tables exist' is semantically correct and therefore strictly and literally true, despite the fact that tables do not exist; its truth in such contexts does not require that the right ontology include tables. (This is what forces them to accept the aforementioned semantic particularism: they lack the resources in their ontology to help themselves to any known compositional semantics in accounting for the truth of ordinary utterances about composite objects.) In serious discussions about ontology, on the other hand, 'tables exist' is semantically incorrect, and therefore strictly and literally false, because in such contexts tables do have to exist in order for the utterance to come out true.

This account of truth is then combined with a context-invariantist thesis about semantic content according to which what an ordinary (non-indexical) sentence like 'tables exist' means does not vary from one context to the next (§3.5). They are therefore committed to a potent form of relativism. For suppose that Julie is in an ordinary context, Kate is in the ontology room, and each utters the sentence 'tables exist'. According to Horgan and Potrč, Julie said something true, Kate said something false, and both said that tables exist. It cannot be both true simpliciter and false simpliciter that tables exist. So Horgan and Potrč have no choice but to maintain that not only sentences but also their contents are true or false only relative to a context. They themselves deny, in §6.3, that they are committed to relativism, but their discussion there has no bearing on the argument just given.

Apart from some suggestive remarks about our ambivalence over whether there really are such things as corporations (§4.3) and frequent reminders about the ubiquity of context-sensitivity, all one finds by way of defense of their conciliatory strategy is an extended argument to the effect that it is part of the "best package" of views that respects ordinary discourse while steering clear of vagueness and arbitrariness. They defend the superiority of their package by raising problems for a variety of competitors: the Lewisian supervaluationist approach (§5.5), various forms of anti-realism (§5.6), various alternative theories of truth (§§5.7.1, 5.7.3, and 5.7.5), paraphrase strategies (§5.7.2), and fictionalism (§5.7.4). This is an instance of a familiar style of argumentation in the material-object metaphysics literature, which one might call "wishful-thinking arguments." One argues at length for some surprising ontological thesis T (in this case, that tables do not exist) and then reasons as follows: the best conciliatory hypothesis on which T is not in conflict with ordinary discourse is H (e.g., that 'tables exist' is context-sensitive); therefore H. The missing premise is that T is not in conflict with ordinary discourse, and that is where the wishful thinking comes in. For there never seems to be any evidence whatsoever for H, which by hypothesis is the best conciliatory strategy on offer.

So, supposing that Horgan and Potrč's arguments for the elimination of tables are sound, error theories on which ordinary utterances of 'tables exist' and the like are simply false must be treated as serious contenders (on pain of wishful thinking). But these theories are given short shrift. Horgan and Potrč evidently think that it is simply perverse to opt for an error theory given the availability of semantic theories (e.g., their own) on which ordinary utterances come out true (pp. 113-4). Yet having to embrace a highly revisionary semantics that is not supported by the linguistic data is not obviously any less of a cost than having to embrace a highly revisionary ontology that is not supported by the intuitive data. The question, then, is whether the semantic costs of Horgan and Potrč's package are outweighed by its ability to secure the truth of ordinary utterances.

In trying to decide this question, it will be instructive to consider one sort of case in which there plainly is no need to secure the truth of a certain bit of ordinary discourse. Consider utterances of 'the earth is flat' in the ancient world (we'll pretend they were in English). Although the earth is not flat, these utterances come out true on the (ridiculous) semantic hypothesis that, in certain contexts, the word 'flat' applies to the entire surface of sufficiently large spheres. It would be misguided to treat that even as a pro tanto reason for accepting this semantic hypothesis. Why? Because (i) there is no linguistic evidence whatsoever that 'flat' ever functions in this way (which of course is not to deny that 'flat' is context-sensitive), and (ii) there is a straightforward explanation of why so many people would mistakenly assert that the earth is flat -- namely, that the earth looked to them to be flat. The indicated semantic hypothesis would just be an explanatory dangler, unnecessary for making sense of their linguistic behavior.

Error theorists might likewise suggest that the folk mistakenly say and believe that there are tables because it looks like there are tables. If this explanation is satisfactory, the error theorist thereby respects folk discourse (by giving an account on which the error is perfectly natural and reasonable) without unnecessarily complicating the semantics.

One might reasonably doubt that this is a satisfactory explanation. After all, there are three-dimensional replicas of the Penrose triangle (the impossible figure on the cover of Nozick's Philosophical Explanations) that from the right vantage point look to be composed of three bars intersecting at right angles,[2] but one would have to be a child or a dimwit to see such a thing and not to realize straightaway that looks must be deceiving. Horgan and Potrč, however, cannot take issue with the error theorist's explanation, for they themselves are committed to this being a satisfactory explanation. What commits them to this being a satisfactory explanation is that they themselves invoke it in response to a certain objection to their conciliatory strategy.

The objection in question is that, even when we (philosophers) are alert to the possibility of contextual shifts, it still seems to us that Horgan and Potrč are saying something obviously false when they say 'tables do not exist' (§6.2). Here is their explanation of why we take them to be saying something obviously false, even though we know that they are engaging in serious ontology (which, by their lights, is a context in which 'tables do not exist' is semantically appropriate):

It is a very plausible psychological hypothesis that humans will be especially prone to think of experientially presented posits as items that are mind-independently real, discourse-independently real … experience immediately presents such items to the experiencer, and presents them as existing 'out there' independently of oneself. (p. 125)

In other words, if it seems to us perceptually that there are things of a certain kind, we will have a strong tendency to judge there to be things of that kind. They go on to suggest that this strong tendency leads to "scorekeeping confusions," that is, failures to recognize that the contextually operative semantic standards have changed in such a way that an utterance that would normally be semantically incorrect is now semantically correct.

One problem with this account is that it's just not true that we are prone to scorekeeping confusions in such cases. Take a perfectly ordinary case of quantifier domain restriction. You are helping me do an inventory of the contents of a certain crate and I say 'there are no books', meaning of course that there are no books in the crate. There happen to be several books in plain sight on a nearby shelf. Contra hypothesis, you do not balk and point incredulously at the books on the shelf, even though "experience immediately presents" you with books. We ordinarily have no trouble recognizing when we are in a context in which what experience immediately presents is irrelevant to assessing utterances about the sorts of things that experience presents us with.

But, more to the point, this account plays right into the hands of the error theorist. For if the fact that experience immediately presents us with tables suffices to explain why we so confidently believe that Horgan and Potrč are wrong to deny that tables exist, it surely also suffices to explain why we so confidently believe that tables exist. So, if their explanation is satisfactory, there evidently is nothing to be gained by making the ordinary utterances come out true, for the same reason that there is nothing to be gained by making past utterances of 'the earth is flat' come out true. Accordingly, if Horgan and Potrč want to show that their conciliatory package is superior to an error-theoretic package, what they need to establish is that there is still something to be gained by securing the truth of the relevant bits of ordinary discourse, even given the availability of this error-theoretic explanation. And they must be careful to do this in a way that does not also vindicate the conciliatory interpretation of 'the earth is flat'. Perhaps this can be accomplished with a sufficiently subtle account of how charity constrains interpretation. But more needs to be said.

The final chapter of Austere Realism contains their articulation and defense of "blobjectivism." The blobjectivist ontology includes (i) the partless but structurally complex blobject, (ii) the properties that are instantiable by the blobject as a whole, and (iii) the instantiation relation itself. (See §7.4.2 for their account of how the blobject can be structurally complex despite being mereologically simple.) By this point in the book, Horgan and Potrč take themselves to have ruled out all views that countenance familiar kinds, and they take there to be two viable alternatives to blobjectivism: universalist ontologies, on which any plurality of "snobjects" (i.e., nonvague particulars) jointly compose a single snobject, and noncompositionalist ontologies which include a multiplicity of mereologically simple snobjects which never jointly compose anything (§7.3). Blobjectivism is argued to be superior to these two competitors, largely on grounds of parsimony (§§7.5-7). Their argument here is fairly compelling, though the real action would seem to lie in their earlier arguments from generality and vagueness against more familiar ontologies.[3]

[1] Ned Markosian introduces this distinction in his "Brutal Composition" (1998), Philosophical Studies, 92: 211-249.

[2] One such replica is depicted on p. 361 of Roy Sorensen's "The Art of the Impossible" (2002), in Gendler and Hawthorne (eds.), Conceivability and Possibility (Oxford University Press).

[3] I am grateful to Kenny Easwaran, Matti Eklund, Terry Horgan, Dave Liebesman, Bryan Pickel, and especially to Chad Carmichael for very helpful discussion of these issues.