Austrian Phenomenology: Brentano, Husserl, Meinong, and Others on Mind and Object

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Robin D. Rollinger, Austrian Phenomenology: Brentano, Husserl, Meinong, and Others on Mind and Object, Ontos, 2008, 326pp., $134.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380057.

Reviewed by Mark Textor, King's College, London


Franz Brentano's work made intentionality a central topic in philosophy and his descriptive philosophy inspired the phenomenological movement founded by his pupil Husserl. Rollinger's Austrian Phenomenology: Brentano, Husserl, Meinong, and Others on Mind and Object brings together ten of his essays devoted to the work of Brentano and his pupils. The topics covered are causation, imagination, perception, judgement and linguistic reference. Rollinger never succumbs to the temptation to write in the philosophical jargon of Brentano and Co., making the book accessible to newcomers to Austrian philosophy.

Several of Rollinger's essays have the flavour of a "compare and contrast" exercise. Representative titles are 'Brentano and Husserl on Imagination', 'Brentano and Meinong', and 'Husserl and Cornelius: Phenomenology, Psychology, and Epistemology'. These essays lay out the development of the mentioned topics in the Austrian school, although additional themes surface in some essays. One example of such a theme is the connection between the Brentano School and British Empiricism. Brentano took Locke to be the founder of the approach to philosophy he himself favoured (p. 15). Rollinger quotes Husserl as saying that in Locke and Hume one can find 'fragments, beginnings of genuine phenomenology' (p. 212). The question of which philosophical insights from Reid, Locke and Hume the Austrians used and reworked is still an underexplored topic that merits further investigation.

On the upside, these essays give the reader a good idea of how Brentano's views were developed and modified by his students. On the downside, some of these essays are indeed "compare and contrast" exercises rather than attempts to approach a philosophical problem through assessing solutions proposed by 'long-dead' philosophers. For example, Cornelius seems to have too little to offer to merit an interesting discussion, and thus appears to be a figure of historical, rather than philosophical, interest.

The book also contains essays, such as 'Meinong on the Objects of Sensation' and 'Meinong on Perception and Objectives', in which Rollinger argues that Austrian philosophers can provide us with new resources to solve philosophical problems, and that they pose new philosophical questions.

'Meinong on the Objects of Sensation' contains a discussion of Meinong's view about the extent of a priori knowledge (p. 124ff). Meinong argues that there is a priori knowledge about colours, shapes and so on. We know a priori that red and green are complementary, that colours exclude each other, that they have 'distances' from each other, etc. Our perceptual colour concepts are acquired by perceiving instances of colours, but that does not prevent us from having a priori knowledge about the colours conceived under these concepts. According to Meinong, 'our knowledge that [red and green] are contrary is based strictly on our grasp of the nature of red and green and is for this reason a priori' (p. 128). But if one can grasp the nature of red and green only if one has experienced instances of red and green, how can the knowledge one acquires be a priori? Perception may play only an enabling role in this case; the perceptual presentation of the colours does not contribute to the warrant of the judgement that red and green are contrary. However, that this is so needs further argument not provided by Meinong. While Meinong has no convincing answer up his sleeve, he deserves credit for making us think about interesting cases that stretch our understanding of the a priori.

In 'Meinong on Objectives and Perception' Rollinger show us how Meinong makes us aware of problems that 'are not easily swept aside as mere peculiarities of an antiquated theory' (p. 231). Meinong argues that all perceptions are judgements. Judgements have objectives or states of affairs as their contents. A distinctive feature of those judgements that are perceptions is that their objectives are 'existences'. Seeing is believing. More precisely, seeing is always believing that something exists; it is never believing that something is thus-and-so (pp. 222-3). Rollinger carefully discusses Meinong's motivations for this view. This discussion is of interest for contemporary philosophers who hold that seeing always has propositional content.

However, one will only be prepared to follow Meinong and his exegete if seeing is indeed believing, at least if the slogan is expanded to seeing that is believing that (for Meinong, that something exists). But so understood the slogan is controversial even in the Brentano school. Rollinger correctly takes Brentano to hold that 'seeing is believing' (p. 222). But for Brentano seeing is never believing that something is; proper seeing is accepting an object. (See Psychology from An Empirical Standpoint, Routledge 1995, pp. 209-210; pp. 50-51 in the second Volume of the German edition.)

Meinong holds that in perception an objective or state of affairs is given to us. The reader will encounter the notion of an objective or state of affairs frequently in the book as it is one of the key-concepts used by Austrian philosophers. If states of affairs are central to the Austrian tradition, we need to know more about them to assess the arguments presented. Are they complex or simple? What are their identity conditions? More on these questions would have been helpful to the reader.

Whatever objectives are, they exist timelessly. If the objective that a particular green tree exists is timelessly the case, why is it only perceivable when the tree is green? Should one revise the conception of states of affairs Meinong shares with other Austrians or his identification of the content of perception as having 'propositional shape'? Rollinger takes this problem to be of more than merely historical interest. Within the Austrian tradition, Husserl (and Brentano before him) responded to Meinong by arguing that genuine perception is a nominal act, an awareness of something that is neither reducible to nor grounded in episodes of thinking that something is so-and so. My seeing the cat on the mat is a nominal positing act: the cat appears to me, not a state of affairs involving the cat. Husserl makes us aware of a possibility in the logical space of theories of perception. Whether it is indeed occupied should be decided by further work.

Philosophers have recently become interested in the methodology of philosophy. Brentano's distinctive take on philosophical methodology distinguishes his and his pupils' work from other philosophical traditions. In contrast to many philosophers before and after him, Brentano held that 'the true method of philosophy is none other than the sciences'; philosophy has a special subject matter, but no special method that sets it apart from the sciences (see pp. 2-19). This view is combined with the thesis that psychology is the basic philosophical discipline. In philosophy one investigates mental phenomena: it is neither conceptual analysis nor transcendental argumentation, but an empirical and descriptive discipline in which the researcher notices phenomena and makes generalizations. For contemporary readers it is certainly not understood that psychology is the basic philosophical discipline (p. 2). Rollinger's otherwise informative discussion is sadly silent on this basic point.

Rollinger's general assessment of the impact and value of Brentano's work for current philosophy is rather glum: Brentano's descriptive psychology is 'invisible' (Dallas Willard). Analytic philosophers don't take notice of it because of their physicalistic prejudices; Continental philosophers are focused on hermeneutics (p. 185ff). On the contrary, it seems to me that Brentano has become very visible in recent years. Physicalists struggle to give plausible accounts of intentionality and consciousness. These problems have encouraged philosophers of mind to look for help in the history of philosophy and Brentano has been a main source of inspiration. (See recent work of Kriegel, Siewert, Thomasson and others.) The value and viability of his descriptive psychology is still a matter of ongoing discussion. But scepticism about descriptive psychology is not merely due to dogmas of current philosophy. The idea that first-person experience is a source of scientific knowledge seems to many philosophers problematic, especially when it comes with such strong claims as Husserl's that in phenomenological investigations causal considerations have no place at all. In view of these problems, a discussion of Brentano's view on the evidence of inner sense would have been most welcome.

Austrian Phenomenology helps one to understand how thinking about intentionality developed in the Brentano School and how it differs from current thinking on this topic. The book is less an attempt to approach philosophical problems from a historical perspective than an attempt to bring what is distinctive of the historical perspective into focus. It points us to interesting ideas of this school, which should be mined further for philosophical insight.