Authenticity as an Ethical Ideal

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Somogy Varga, Authenticity as an Ethical Ideal, Routledge, 2011, 198pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415895330.

Reviewed by Charles Guignon, University of South Florida


Somogy Varga is a fairly new light in the skies of Anglophone philosophy. He received his Ph.D. under Axel Honneth at Frankfurt University studying critical social theory, and he has been a research scholar at Dan Zahavi's Center for Subjectivity Research in Copenhagen. Authenticity as an Ethical Ideal is his first full-length monograph, and it presents us with a scholar who has an extensive knowledge of many areas of moral psychology as well as a solid grasp of the methods of ideology critique. The book engages important issues, addresses them in an intelligent way, and argues effectively for some innovative views. It is also flawed, as I shall have to show, but the flaws are outweighed by the originality and depth of the overall book.

Varga addresses a topic that has been picking up steam in recent years, the concept of authenticity found in both popular culture and in scholarly discussions of the good life. It has been discussed recently by Charles Taylor (1991) and Allesandro Ferrara (1992), as well as by Bernard Williams (2002) and others, including myself (2004). As a rule, authenticity is seen as a matter of being true to oneself in one's avowals and actions. It assumes that each individual has distinctive feelings, desires and convictions that are of genuine importance to that individual, and that each person ought to express those self-defining attitudes in what he or she does. Doing this is regarded as "being faithful to what one is," and this is seen as a genuinely worthy way of being.

From its first appearance, this ideal of authenticity was found to be potentially at odds with the social norms accepted by the surrounding community. To be authentic, it seems, is to stand in opposition to the "ethical" as it is ordinarily understood. In our modern world, however, it is often supposed that being authentic is such a great good that it should trump the ethical. One should "be oneself" no matter how much this runs against the prevailing norms. And this means that there is an inbuilt hostility between authenticity and ethics, even in those cases where one in fact acts in agreement with social norms. For if one is always capable of breaking with those norms, one is in some sense already outside the ethical.

Varga's Authenticity and the Ethical Ideal courageously takes on this disagreeable consequence of the project of being authentic by trying to show that there is a way to reconcile authenticity and ethics. The book consists of three parts. In the first two, Varga examines the existing literature on this subject, critically examines some widely accepted models of authenticity, and looks for a "formal concept" of this ideal that avoids the negative consequences of traditional models. He concludes that because authenticity, properly understood, is inseparably bound up with ethical ideals, the appearance of a conflict between the two can be mitigated. The third and final part of the book introduces some innovative reflections on the connections between being authentic and the peculiar structure and demands of current forms of capitalism. This is a promising new direction, but space constraints will not permit me to do justice to this critical-social development.

After reviewing some of the literature on authenticity and discussing his method in Part I, Varga turns in the next part to a critical examination of two common "models of authenticity" widely accepted in writings on this subject. The first model, attributed to Jean-Jacques Rousseau, is called an "inner sense" model. This is the view that the inner self contains a variety of states, including feelings, desires and motivations, and that the individual has access to these "stable and given inner properties" (62) through something called "introspection." According to this introspectionist view, the "question of authenticity" (69, also 76, 121) -- the question of how I should "live my life so that it expresses who I truly am" -- is answered by the injunction that I get in touch with my deepest feelings and desires and act in such a way that my actions express those motivations. The second model Varga criticizes is called the "productionist" model. It claims that self-actualization results from creating a self in the course of what one does. Here, metaphors of making replace metaphors of finding. Although this view is attributed to Nietzsche and Foucault, the paradigmatic exemplar is Richard Rorty's conception of the liberal ironist who cooks up a self through adopting a vocabulary he knows to be contingent and arbitrary. Rorty's ironist is concerned only with "self-enlargement," not with purity or being faithful to anything.

Varga goes on to attack both these models, but I must say I find his characterizations of the models to be caricatures that have only a limited connection to philosophers involved in the discussion. Varga's picture of the inner sense, which may fit Locke and the empiricists, does not seem to be fair to Rousseau, who in his various confessions calls attention to the ephemeral and shifting nature of the inner life. Varga is right to say that no explanation is given of the "mechanism" of introspection. But ever since Vico, philosophers have pointed to the ordinary sense an agent has of what he or she is up to in the midst of everyday acting in the world. For Vico, there is a type of awareness that, "unlike perception of the external world," is a "knowledge of activities of which we, the knowing subjects, are ourselves the authors, endowed with motives, purposes and a continuous social life, which we understand, as it were, from inside" (Berlin, 2000: 41). It is true that the "mechanism" governing this self-awareness is not made evident. But it is equally true that, as Heidegger's (1962) phenomenologies of Befindlichkeit and Stimmung ("how we find ourselves" and "attunement") indicate, we have no need for a faculty psychology and its mechanisms to grasp this sort of self-awareness. Merleau-Ponty (2012) and Charles Taylor (1985) have shown that the spooling out of a life can be grasped as an embodied flow in which the distinction between inner and outer has no role to play in engendering our sense of self.

Pace Varga, these authors also show that the mentalistic process of making explicit and endorsing inner convictions, a process Varga cleverly calls "authentication," is neither necessary nor commonly found in the midst of our active lives. We can be true to ourselves as these selves appear without undertaking the processes of "endorsement" and "deliberation" posited by the "myth of the mental." It is worth noting that, although Varga rejects the idea of inner motivations that have to be discovered, his own view of the "performative" self later in the book depends on our having access to self-defining commitments that are just as much "discovered" as they are chosen.

With respect to "productionist" models of authenticity, we should start by noting how the very name chosen for this model loads the dice against it. We get a picture of the mechanical processes of the assembly line in a manufacturing operation. The more common term for this sort of view, "constitution," avoids these implications. But once Rorty's conceit of self-construction out of linguistic Legos has been proposed, any sort of self-constitution view is bound to look foolish. With respect to what are called "productionist" views of the self, Varga argues that the materials for such constructions are already meaning-laden, so that emotions (the medium in which value commitments come to life) must be prior to concatenations into selves. The claim that emotions must be active in constituting a self might prove to be a challenge to Rorty, but it presents no problems for thinkers such as Taylor, MacIntyre (1984) and John Davenport (2012). These "narrative self" theorists start from an understanding of the kind of self-constitution found in the ways an individual composes his or her autobiography by enacting various roles in the public world.

This observation brings to light one of the central problems with Varga's book. He is examining the idea of authenticity and in doing so is led to questions about the self that we are supposed to be true to when we are true to ourselves. All of this is quite in order. The problem that arises here, however, is that Varga, in shifting to the question 'What is the self?' has in fact changed the subject. For now he is dealing with the familiar range of questions called "problems of personal identity," and these questions, though related to problems about authenticity, do not directly connect with the topic of what it is to be authentic.

The resulting inquiry into the make-up of a self appears without a clear transition. Varga's claim that motivations can count as part of my self only if they are authenticated leads him to an interesting discussion of Frankfurt's conception of wholeheartedness as basic to identity formation, and that in turn leads to an account of "identification" as involving a commitment to something that gives content to the self. Identifications have constancy and consistency throughout a lifetime, and thereby unify the self. This is heady stuff and the reader is sure to benefit from Varga's penetrating analyses and phenomenological descriptions. But the conclusion of this discussion seems dissatisfying. Varga tells us that "authenticity is about wholeheartedness concerning . . . commitments," or, again, it is "about the integration of one's life over time," and so forth (83). The colloquial construction "it's all about X" gives the text a homey, comfortable ring. But the truth of the matter is that saying "authenticity is about wholeheartedness" is actually quite unclear. "About" in what sense? Review the argument for a moment. First we were told that authenticity is "about" being true to one's self. Then we were told that to understand this, we need a model that will show what the true self is. Then we are given a picture of a self that has wholehearted commitments. But saying what the self is does not by itself tell us what authenticity is. It does not show us why authenticity is "about" wholeheartedness.

As critics of Frankfurt-based identity theories have pointed out, a strong conception of the self as defined by wholeheartedness may be appealing to academics and dedicated professionals, but it does not give us a very plausible picture of the typical selves we in fact find around us. Ordinary people generally have multiple commitments, and those commitments have varying degrees of intensity. A person is a professor, a mother, a caregiver to older parents, an aspiring violinist, a wise shopper, and so on. She may be deeply committed to some of these roles, but there does not seem to be anything by virtue of which these roles can be bound together into a unified "fundamental project." Nor is it obvious that a conjunctivist approach to these involvements is possible. Some of these projects clash with one another, so that giving yourself wholeheartedly to one makes it hard to realize the others adequately. As a consequence, many of us just muddle along through life trying to do the best we can, giving ourselves fully to some roles when we are caught up in them, but then putting them aside when we are called on to be, for example, good parents. The picture of the self as having wholehearted commitments may begin to seem rather monomaniacal and biased toward aristocratic conceptions of roles. It does not help that Varga only considers one example throughout the entire course of his book: Martin Luther. We might have a high regard for Martin Luther but in the end say, "I am no Martin Luther."

The puzzles this raises for Authenticity and the Ethical Ideal are systemic and far-reaching. Varga starts with a question about an attempt to achieve an ideal way of living and ends up talking about what appears to be an ideal sort of self. His reflections on this topic touch on some of the most interesting discussions currently underway in philosophy, and he has many important contributions to make. His central argument tries to show that, whatever authenticity turns out to be, it has to be understood as something embedded in the social values and projects of a community. Varga presents effective arguments to connect this ideal to what Heideggerians call the "background," where this refers to a dynamic lifeworld of shared interpretations and undertakings aimed at achieving recognition. I am fully in agreement with these noble ideas and deeply impressed by Vargas' contribution here. Especially original and useful are his accounts of Frankfurt's "volitional necessities" and Taylor's notion of our commitments as being articulations of publically shared values.

Most interesting to me was his attempt to show that the prevailing conception of authenticity as the goal of life has been co-opted and incorporated into the entrepreneurial sort of capitalism that is spreading across the globe. Varga concludes his somewhat visionary book by diagnosing certain psychological pathologies -- in particular, depression and exhaustion -- that are increasingly endemic to capitalist practice guided by the newer ideals of authenticity. What is missing in this ingenious book, however, is a clear distinction between the project of being true to oneself and so-called "practices of authenticity" in which one is a person of a special sort.


Berlin, Isaiah (2000). Three Critics of the Enlightenment: Vico, Hamann, Herder. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Davenport, John J. (2012). Narrative Identity, Autonomy, and Mortality: From Frankfurt and MacIntyre to Kierkegaard. New York: Routledge.

Ferrara, Allesandro (1992). Modernity and Authenticity: A Study of the Social and Ethical Thought of Jean-Jacques Rousseau. Albany: SUNY Press.

Guignon, Charles (2004). On Being Authentic. New York: Routledge.

Heidegger, Martin (1962). Being and Time, trans. Maquarrie and Robinson. New York: Harper & Row.

MacIntyre, Alasdair (1984). After Virtue: A Study in Moral Theory, 2nd ed. Notre Dame, Ind.: University of Notre Dame Press.

Merleau-Ponty, Maurice (2012). Phenomenology of Perception, trans. D. A. Landes. London: Routledge.

Taylor, Charles (1991). The Ethics of Authenticity. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Taylor, Charles (1985). Human Agency and Language, Philosophical Papers vol. 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Williams, Bernard (2002). Truth and Truthfulness. Princeton: Princeton University Press.