Authorities: Conflicts, Cooperation, and Transnational Legal Theory

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Nicole Roughan, Authorities: Conflicts, Cooperation, and Transnational Legal Theory, Oxford University Press, 2013, 288pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199671410.

Reviewed by Patrick Taylor Smith, Stanford University


Our world is increasingly populated by a diverse constellation of legal and political agents. This order, in part generated by the growth of international governance and globalization, is sometimes cooperative, sometimes conflict-ridden, and oftentimes both simultaneously. Despite this multiplicity, these legal and political actors still claim authority over their subjects. This book aims to show that a pluralistic system of legitimate political and legal authority is possible, desirable, and fairly common in our world. Those who come to it looking for a substantive account of legitimate authority or for principles of justice that might regulate global governance institutions will come away disappointed, but those who are looking for a new and intriguing way to understand the legal, constitutional, and political pluralism that characterizes and regulates global governance and international law will find much of value. All in all, Nicole Roughan provides a densely argued, clear-headed, and deeply informed exploration of the concept of legal and political pluralism. Ultimately, it is not clear whether her account of 'relative authority' accomplishes the task she sets for it, but relativity nonetheless represents an intriguing and insightful contribution to the literature on authority.

Roughan separates accounts of authority into two broad categories: procedural and substantive. Procedural authorities derive their power from how they make decisions, usually with a focus on whether they have the consent of their subjects. In international law, this view is usually expressed by the idea that international institutions are legitimate only if they receive state consent. Roughan treats Joseph Raz's influential 'service account' as the paradigmatic substantive view. Substantive authorities derive their authority from the fact that deference to their commands will lead their subjects to act in greater conformity with reason. In the international context, this view is often reflected in the claims of authority for governance institutions -- such as the World Trade Organization or the World Health Organization -- that play a necessary coordinative function or have the relevant expertise such that states and their citizens would better satisfy their own interests if they followed the dictates of the authoritative institution.

Roughan persuasively argues for two claims concerning these accounts. First, they are 'absolute' views. That is, they are committed to evaluating claims of authority by making reference only to facts about the authority and her relationship with her subject. So, we do not need to know how the authority relates to other authorities. We merely need to know whether this subject has the relevant legitimating relationship with this particular authority. Second, Roughan argues that both accounts allow for overlap or conflicts between equally legitimate authorities. Procedurally, it is easy to imagine cases where the relevant procedural values apply to more than one authority. For example, someone may vote, in separate yet fair elections, for two different legislatures at different levels of administration. In the substantive case, Roughan presents several sources of plurality (e.g., the difference between action and decision, side effects, etc.), but I will focus on what I take to be the simplest source of conflict: value pluralism giving rise to conflicts between different interests. That is, one authority appropriately tells the subject to do X while another authority -- focusing her expertise on a different set of values -- appropriately tells the subject to do Y. Given the relevant values, the subject would do better by deferring to either authority, but each authority demands that the person do something different.

The question now becomes how to respond to this potential plurality of legitimate authority. It seems implausible that, for example, we could rely on social facts about obedience or constitutional rules to resolve potential conflicts for two reasons: there might not be a constitution or social consensus and, even if there were, there remains a question of why those facts or rules are justified or authoritative. So, Roughan argues that we need some principled way of determining which authority trumps. And importantly, this determination must be available to the subject in a way that is consistent with the various authorities remaining authoritative. One feature of authority, according to the Razian view, is that the dictates of the authority preempt the judgment of the subject: the subject is blocked from considering the direct reasons for action as she is supposed to follow the authority's commands because the authority commands it. Roughan argues that in order for the authority not to be vitiated in the face of conflict, the subject must be able to identify which authority trumps the other with only non-preempted reasons. So, when one authority orders X and another authority orders Y, the subject must then be able to decide which authority wins out without referring to reasons that each legitimate authority can appropriately demand be preempted. Roughan then argues that it is quite implausible that a subject would be able -- with a reasonable amount of time and effort -- to identify the superior authority using only non-preempted reasons available to the subject. The service account is then faced with a serious dilemma: either the subject will be able to act non-arbitrarily by effectively determining which authority to obey at the cost of the claim to authority being dissipated, or the conflicting claims to authority will be upheld at the cost of the subject being unable to act according to good reasons at a reasonable cost to her agency.

Roughan argues that we can avoid this dilemma if we give up the "absolutism" of prior accounts to authority in favor of her "relative" account. Roughan's relative account differs from the other views she describes in two ways. First, she develops a hybrid account of authority that depends on both procedural and substantive elements. Yet, this only increases the possibility for plurality because, by multiplying the various ways of evaluating authority, the account increases the ways in which different authorities can be incommensurably or equally valuable. Second, and more importantly, Roughan rejects the independence of authority judgments. In order for an agent or institution to have legitimate authority, it must have the appropriate relationship with all other relevant authorities. So, as long as there are multiple, legitimate authorities, we cannot simply look at one prima facie authority and its relationship with its subjects in order to know whether it is justified. Rather, we need to look at the entire web of relationships between the multiple authorities. Roughan is generally agnostic about the form these relationships can take: they can be informal, dialogic, and cooperative, or they can be integrated through formal and hierarchical lines of jurisdiction and deference. The nature of the relationships will strongly depend on context, governance issue, the nature of the various authorities, the urgency of the need for coordination, and the side effects of their authoritative relations. In all cases, the key feature of Roughan's view is that a purported authority is not legitimate unless it actually instantiates the appropriate relations with other legitimate authorities.

It is important to note that Roughan's argument for the relativity view crucially depends on a normative claim. It is certainly true that many legal orders, including and especially those associated with global governance, are descriptively pluralistic. There are many purported authorities. However, Roughan acknowledges that we could imagine a much more integrated and monistic system where all authorities are clearly and hierarchically organized so that no difficult questions of deference or conflict arise. In a sense, we need a reason not to create a single authority that makes the all-things-considered judgments in cases where authority is needed. It is merely a contingent fact about how our legal and political systems developed that they are not structured in ways that are more conducive to absolute accounts of authority. Of course, there is value in characterizing existing relations and practices, but the relative authority view makes a normative claim about when prima facie authority is justified. So, this naturally raises the worry that the global political order is descriptively pluralistic, but the ideal system, normatively, would be unified and monistic.

Roughan is aware of this worry and offers a normative foundation of pluralism. She writes that "The strongest normative case for a conception of relative authority, and a pluralist theory of legitimacy built upon a relativity condition, is tied to the value of plurality" (145). In Roughan's terms, she wants to argue that the balance of "governance reasons" favor having a complex plurality of legitimate authorities over a unitary or hierarchical system. Her argument relies on value pluralism at the individual and community level. Plurality at the level of authority reflects reasonable differences between individuals and communities over how to balance and understand a variety of values.

In her final chapter, Roughan discusses a typically complicated balancing act concerning river use in New Zealand (238-239): cultural values of the Maori need to be balanced against possible economic benefits while also protecting a variety of environmental values. Roughan suggests that these different values will be better protected and furthered by having a system where we recognize both the authority of the Crown in advocating for certain values and the authority of Maori political agents in advocating for others. On the other hand, she argues that the values that typically militate in favor of unity -- the rule of law especially -- can be maintained or furthered in a plural system to a much greater extent through dialogue than is typically understood. As a consequence, the extent to which authorities need to be organized along clear lines of jurisdiction or hierarchy will be a contextual matter of weighing the protection of 'difference' against the need for more effective coordination, which is, perhaps, a consequence of unification. Roughan concludes -- not without justification -- that there is no reason to think, a priori, that a weighing of these governance reasons will always come out in favor of unification rather than pluralism.

One potential issue I see with the addition of the relativity condition is that it could exacerbate rather than solve the identification problem. Let's return to Roughan's most detailed example: Crown-Maori relations in New Zealand. In order for a subject to know  whether either Maori or Crown political agents are authorities, she would have to know that the Maori and the Crown are relating in a way that is consistent with the relevant governance reasons, does not create problematic side effects, and does not undermine the ability of each authority to assist their subjects in acting in conformity to reason. This is a tall order for a couple of reasons.

First, it is likely that value pluralism implies 'relationship pluralism'. That is, it seems that different values will demand different relationships between authorities. For example, economic regulation in order to serve various environmental and labor values will likely require considerable unification and coordination; otherwise, corporations wishing to avoid those regulations will forum shop or seek more favorable jurisdictions. On the other hand, certain social values -- like protecting religious or cultural practices -- may very well be best served by relationships with other authorities that are dialogic, ad hoc, and informal. Yet, both values may be at play in the same dispute. As a consequence, selecting the appropriate relationship seems to depend on making precisely the judgment that seemed so difficult in the case of the absolute accounts.

Second, even if there were a single correct answer to what constitutes the correct relationship between equally legitimate authorities that seem to have different requirements for coordination and unification, it is hard to see how a subject could be expected to make those judgments under anything like a reasonable cognitive load. This is made even more difficult if we require, as we must, that the subject make these relativity judgments without referring to any reasons that might be preempted by the relevant authorities.

Another worry concerns her normative argument for pluralism and how it intersects with coercion. My concern is that Roughan's arguments for pluralism in authority look much weaker if the relevant authorities are coercive. While I am sympathetic, pace Roughan (24-26), to the idea that public authority is intrinsically coercive, I do not think one needs to be committed to that view for the worry to have force. After all, even if public authorities are not necessarily coercive, they often are. So, we might be worried that even if Roughan has described a system of legitimate plurality, she has not really described a system that could plausibly be our own.

The problem is that coercion generates governance reasons in favor of unity at the expense of plurality. If authority only involves commands that are ultimately up to the subject to follow, then we might plausibly think that there are some cases where there is no pressing reason to subordinate one command to another. But if those contrary prescriptions are backed by coercive force, then such neutrality is harder to maintain. After all, one either has or does not have a coercively-backed entitlement to economically exploit a river. Conversely, one either has or does not have a coercively backed entitlement to prevent economic exploitation of the river. At some point, a final decision about which entitlements apply needs to be made. Furthermore, relying on informal and ad hoc dialogue looks much less attractive in the context of competing, legitimate commands backed by force. The reason is that the process by which one authority "wins" should be subject to mechanisms of control, adjudication, and contestation in much the same way as particular, coercive authorities. It is strange to think that the formal tools of the rule of law are necessary to align the coercive power of one authority with the interests and freedoms of its subjects, but that we do not need these tools to control and check the process by which two or more authorities determine which set of prescriptions are coercively enforced. This is especially true since it is ultimately that process which will determine if the authority will be effective in protecting and furthering the entitlements of its subjects. In other words, I worry that cooperative and dialogic relationships between coercive authorities -- without democratic accountability and rule of law -- are much more likely to be façades for geopolitical rivalry and conflict than builders of true consensus. If so, the argument for formal unity and integration is stronger for coercive authorities than perhaps Roughan realizes. In any case, these two objections are really invitations for her to continue to work on what seems to be a promising and new approach to authority in the face of plurality.

This review, by necessity, cannot do full justice to the dense and careful argumentation that fills the book. Beyond presenting a novel account of authority, the first part of the book also provides an admirably clear presentation of dominant accounts of authority. What's more, Roughan's taxonomy of different authority relations and discussion of constitutional pluralism are useful for those looking for an entrance into the complex world of international jurisprudence. So, despite the fact that I remain somewhat unconvinced that Roughan's account of relative authority solves the problems caused by a plurality of legitimate authorities, her book should be of interest to advanced graduate students and law students as well as specialists in political philosophy and philosophy of law.