Authority and the Metaphysics of Political Communities

Authority And The Metaphysics Of Political Communities

Gabriele De Anna, Authority and the Metaphysics of Political Communities, Routledge, 2020, 242pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367438296.

Reviewed by Johan Brännmark, Malmö University


Gabriele De Anna has worked in many areas of philosophy, especially in metaphysics (on substances) and in value theory (on natural normativity), and in this book he works his way from both of these areas, as well as some philosophy of action, into an original account of political communities that stresses the role of political authority. It is this broad approach to understanding political communities that really makes De Anna's book stand apart from most work done in social ontology or political theory, which typically sets general metaphysics to the side.

The basic picture that De Anna starts out from involves a contrast between two conceptions of politics. There is the classical one, which can be found in Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics, and Aquinas. It embraces a thick philosophical anthropology, with a teleological conception of human nature and the political community, where a well-functioning instantiation of the latter is seen as prerequisite for human beings fully realizing themselves and achieving freedom as agents. Then there is the modern one, which runs from 17th century thinkers like Hobbes and Locke to 20th century ones like Jürgen Habermas and John Rawls. It embraces a thin philosophical anthropology, with human agents just having different drives and interests rather than some shared telos, and with the world being, to use a Weberian phrase, a disenchanted place. On this picture, being part of a political community will always involve limiting one's freedom in certain ways, with contract theory being the dominant model of determining under which terms such limitations can be justified.

Of course, this kind of contrast is a simplification, and De Anna is hardly unaware of this. As a basic story, it still helps explain the project in his book, although one might perhaps have wished that the picture had been complicated at least somewhat more. There are clearly important authors (such as Martha Nussbaum, who, a bit curiously, is not discussed in the book) who integrate elements of classical moral and political philosophy into what is still a modern and liberal approach to politics. De Anna arguably also sometimes overstates the sentiments of modernity, such as when suggesting that politics "came to be seen as a necessary evil" (4). While it is perhaps true that early contract theorists saw the entering into a political community as a live question, for many contemporary political liberals the question is more about how than if there should be government. Yet, even if there are some such quibbles, there is ultimately no denying that especially someone like Rawls, who is probably the main theorist that De Anna seeks to contrast his own approach to, is very clear on wanting to set metaphysical issues aside, even while acknowledging that for many people a variety of ideas about religion and human nature might be essential to their self-understanding and their reasoning about how to lead their lives. From the perspective of that kind of liberal political theorist, however, this plurality simply has to be taken as a fact, the principal question being not about which metaphysics is the most reasonable one, but rather about which principles of justice can work as a common denominator given that there will be a plurality of metaphysical and religious views, as well as conceptions of the good, in the political community. It is this setting aside of metaphysical matters that De Anna rejects, and in doing so he also argues for something like a return to the classical conception of politics, although certainly in an updated form.

The book has three main parts, the first of which is called "Substance". It outlines De Anna's basic metaphysical framework. Now, if we look at many of the worries that De Anna raises with respect to traditional liberal political theory, they are often echoing points made already in the resurgence of virtue ethics and the liberalism-communitarianism debate in the 1980s, but one thing that tended to characterize those interventions was that, while they were often influenced by Aristotelian moral and political theory, they tended to distance themselves from Aristotelian metaphysics. Since then, however, there has also been a resurgence of a more classical and often broadly Aristotelian conception of metaphysics, especially in the return to reasoning in terms of substances and real essences exemplified by writers like Kit Fine, Kathrin Koslicki, and Anna Marmodoro. Potentially, this means that there is now a metaphysical toolbox of classical ideas and concepts that have been reframed in the context of contemporary metaphysics available for those who seek to explore the classical conception of politics, and who also think that, rather than setting metaphysics aside, it is something that the political philosopher should engage with.

For De Anna specifically, a central concern in considering political communities is the question of their unity. Indeed, this is a central question for any account of communities or groups: what is it that makes them into a distinct community or group? Traditional accounts in social ontology or political theory often address this question head-on, without considering it in the broader metaphysical context of understanding individuation and unity. But De Anna first wants a more general answer, and he opts for a version of hylomorphism, where an object is the individual object that it is because its parts are held together in a certain way. He then also argues for substance gradualism, i.e., that objects can be substances at different degrees, and distinguishes real substances from quasi-substances, where the former are substances in a strict sense and where the latter are such that we think of them as substances, but where the principles of unity organizing them are really operating on a lower level than the one at which our relevant sortal concepts apply. Now, there might be good reasons for detailing one's approach to substances in this fashion anyway, but it should also be clear why it is attractive for De Anna: it allows for a wide applicability of the conceptual framework, even to things like political communities.

The second part, "Practical Reason", starts moving towards understanding the specific principles of unity holding political communities together. Since political communities are made up of human individuals, it is reasonable to think that they are somehow held together through bonds between such individuals as members of those communities and that these bonds are formed through human action. And so we need an account of human action. A key component to De Anna's approach here is the idea that we need to think about action partly from a first-person perspective, or the perspective of an agent, and that we cannot just take an objective or third-personal view: in order to know what action a person is performing, we need to understand her reasons for doing it. Given this starting-point, an analysis of human action will be partly phenomenological, focusing on what it is like to be a human agent. On De Anna's closer analysis, reason-giving facts are about deficiencies, i.e., lacks of perfection, which then ground certain potential ways of making a situation better. The basic normativity involved here need not be strong, but is about what he calls "factual normativity", and where the simplest examples might involve the normativity of artifacts (e.g., a blunt knife holds the potential of being improved by being sharpened), but it is not restricted to just artifacts. From the perspective of us as agents, we inhabit a teleologically structured world, where we are provided with reasons for acting by how there are different possibilities of improving the situations that we face.

But do we really inhabit a world of values? An evolutionary naturalist might accept something like De Anna's account as a reasonably correct phenomenological description, but still understand it as little more than an illusion, similar to the stick in the water appearing to be bent. Leaning on Thomas Nagel, De Anna then suggests that if evolutionary naturalism renders our sense of moral reality as something illusory, then that is a problem for evolutionary naturalism rather than our belief in moral reality. In order to explain how the teleological structure of the world as we encounter it is not illusory, De Anna argues that our best option is to postulate a first cause involving intentionality. Although he does not delve deeper into the question of how this conception of a first cause falls in line with notions of God in traditional religions, it is clear that it must be conscious and quite powerful. This particular move is probably one that many readers might not want to go along with, and for some it might even be taken as a modus tollens rather than a modus ponens, i.e., as an argument against the idea that moral reality should be understood in teleological terms (given the price that would have to be paid). It should however be recognized that any moral realist faces an explanatory challenge in accounting for why our purported intuitive sense of moral reality is to be understood as largely correct.

Finally, the third part, "Authority", moves into political philosophy. As noted by De Anna, a lot of traditional liberal political theory has focused on the matter of legitimacy, seeking to explain under which circumstances the governed are under an obligation to comply with those that govern (or alternatively: what those that govern can do without overstepping the bounds of how they can legitimately act). Yet on the kind of alternative conception of politics favored by De Anna, community belonging runs much deeper and is really a precondition for our agency and rationality. As he has argued in the second part, human action aims at improvement, at excelling, and this pursuit is grounded in the identities that we acquire by being embedded in particular communities. The well-functioning political community, then, does not just help us in becoming better agents by providing us with basic economic resources, but also by providing a context where we can learn and grow. On this kind of conception, those that govern are arguably more than mere administrators, but rather leaders in a sense where authority becomes a more important issue than legitimacy.

On De Anna's general account of authority, a person acts on the advice of some other person, but without doing so also on the basis of reasons that she has independently of her advisor. Taking advice in this sense is not about merely receiving some input, but about choosing to take that advice as the dominant rationale for doing something. De Anna starts building this account of authority from basic examples of practical authority, such as medical authority (where one can be perfectly reasonable in following advice from one's physician without it being a blind leap of faith), but then moves on to moral and political authority. In all of these forms, authority is on this account inextricably linked to trust (and trustworthiness). Indeed, for De Anna, the main question about the relation between those who govern and those who are governed is not much about whether the former are overstepping the bounds of legitimate government action, but whether elites are acting with an eye towards the common good or not -- if not, then they are not really worthy of trust from the general population and, at least in the long run, this can then lead to a crisis in the community. In line with his account of substances as being held together by certain forces, the endurance of the political community is crucially supported through individuals respecting political authority, abiding by the commands and decisions of those members of the community that occupy positions of authority.

In assessing the book, it can be said that its greatest strength is perhaps also its greatest weakness, namely that it spans so many existing debates. It makes the book a showcase for the possibility of integrating what otherwise are ideas and arguments that tend not to come into contact with each other. But as a reader one is also often left wanting more. For instance, as already pointed out, his move towards a theological underpinning of moral realism is bound to leave some readers dissatisfied. An account on which the world is teleologically structured would however seem possible to ground in a more thoroughly communitarian approach as well. A lot of contemporary social ontology insists on the reality of social constructs, where even if social facts might change if the community changes, for me as an individual, these would simply be the facts being in place. Granted, this kind of realism would have a relativist slant to it, but it would still have been nice to see a more developed exploration of this possibility, especially since it would fit quite well with De Anna's emphasis on community belonging and participation as an essential part of being an agent capable of reasoning well and improving oneself. Potentially, one might even worry that a theological underpinning of the teleologically structured world that we face as agents might be taken to motivate a turning away from the political community (which is bound to be at least somewhat heterogeneous), and towards sources of authority that can be found in smaller more tight-knit religious communities.

Another worry is about De Anna's starting-point in developing his account of authority, namely the role of the good advisor. While one of the strengths of De Anna's book lies in his focus on matters of trust, which are clearly very pertinent to the political fissures that we find in many liberal democracies today, it is not clear that the model figure here should be that of the good advisor, but maybe instead something like the good representative. The case of trusting someone's advice seems highly relevant for the moral domain, where we can often turn to someone that we find morally insightful in order to get advice on how to choose in difficult cases, but then we are still the ones performing the relevant actions. Yet how often do we turn to political leaders for advice or guidance? Rather, the kind of trust that comes into play here seems to be about trusting someone to act in our interest or on our behalf. Indeed, something like this often appears to be what De Anna has in mind, since he worries about elites not being oriented towards the common good in their actions. But the question, then, is whether authority is the most suitable notion for understanding the essential forms of trust (and trustworthiness) that need to be involved here for the political community to function well. Arguably, at least in a modern democratic society, while elites are needed in order to run its complex machinery, the people who occupy key positions in government and the bureaucracy should perhaps not so much be our good shepherds, but rather be more like our faithful servants -- taking direction, rather than giving direction.