Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays

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John Christman and Joel Anderson (eds), Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism: New Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 398pp, $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521839513.

Reviewed by Paul Weithman, University of Notre Dame


Autonomy is generally taken to be a central value -- indeed, it is often taken to be the central value -- of political and ethical liberalism. Because so many philosophers are liberals, we take it for granted that autonomy is something we should be for. But although many of us take the value of autonomy as axiomatic, our agreement on the axiom masks widespread disagreement on its truth-conditions and corollaries. Contemporary philosophers hold very different views about what it is for a person to be autonomous. They rely on different intuitions about what conduct is autonomous when they try to say what autonomy is. They differ significantly about what kind of autonomy is central to liberalism and about what autonomy's centrality consists in.

The book under review brings together thirteen newly commissioned essays by Diana Tietjens Meyers, David Velleman, Marina Oshana, Paul Benson, Joel Anderson and Axel Honneth, Marilyn Friedman, Richard Dagger, Joseph Heath, Rainer Forst, Bert van den Brink, Gerald Gaus, Jeremy Waldron and John Christman. The collection as a whole is instructive and bracing because the essays, when read together, illustrate these differences so clearly. A book one of whose merits is its illustration of such differences is a book that will have to strain for thematic unity that is more than nominal. But the substantial introduction by the co-editors, and the frequent cross-references by the contributors, help to bridge a number of gaps.

As clearly as this collection portrays the diversity of current work on autonomy, it is still not as complete a depiction as readers might like. There is some work on autonomy the existence of which is suggested only by the long shadows it casts from beyond the frame of the portrait and by the stances contributors adopt toward antagonists who are off to the sides. There are some views of autonomy that, if incorporated into the picture, would have made this collection even more fully representative of current work on autonomy. Certain contributors, most notably Gerald Gaus, associate autonomy with acting or being able to act from principles of duty. But on at least some views, autonomy is not simply a matter of doing one's duty or obeying the moral law. It is a matter of a rational agent's acting from a law which has authority because she gives it to herself. This collection would have benefited from an essay that explored a connection that seems to be at work only in Forst's essay: the connection between autonomy and the source of the authority moral principles enjoy. But even though such a contribution would have been a welcome addition, Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism is still among the books that will prove essential for those who want to know the state of current work. Readers will be grateful for the copious notes, which enable them to trace leads to other contemporary work on autonomy and to seminal work of the recent and more distant past.

The essays in this book do not simply show the current state of work on autonomy. Many of them help to advance discussion of the questions they take up. In a short review, it is unfortunately not possible to discuss all of the essays in Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism or, indeed, to do justice to any of them. I especially regret not being able to give sustained attention to the very interesting essays by Anderson and Honneth, by Gaus and by Velleman, though Velleman's essay on the self lies somewhat to the side of the volume's focal point. I began with some very general claims about what differences there are among philosophers who agree on the value of autonomy. Here I shall simply try to substantiate those remarks by commenting on the essays by Meyers, Forst, Dagger, and Waldron and by showing how their essays illustrate the differences I listed.

Diana Tietjens Meyers attacks theories of autonomy which "focus on [the] critical reason and rationally mandated volition" (28) that she associates with what she calls "the unitary self" (28-9). The problem with these theories, she thinks, is that they are unable to accommodate much of the conduct that she thinks is autonomous. Meyers concludes that an account of autonomy capable of capturing all our autonomous conduct must "recognize the social self, the relational self, the divided self and the embodied self" as well as the unitary self "as potential sites of autonomous self-discovery, self-definition and self-direction." (28)

To support this conclusion, Meyers develops two examples of her own conduct that she takes to have been autonomous and that she thinks implicate these other selves. One example concerns her hiking down a mountain to safety with two broken wrists. This, she thinks, was a case of autonomous action by her embodied self. The other concerns her adherence to dietary restrictions, which she says is facilitated by telling friends about the metabolic condition that requires her to observe them. She says "I don't ask people to encourage me to stick to my diet, and no one ever has. Yet their knowing presence keeps me from violating my diet." (33) By establishing networks of friends whose "knowing presence" keeps her on her diet, Meyers says, she has "transferred some of my agentic powers to our relationships." (33) This enables her "self-as-relational to autonomously refuse harmful delectables." (33)

We might wonder, however, whether all of the conduct that Meyers thinks is autonomous is really best described that way. If Meyers sticks to her diet because she has "transferred some of [her] agentic powers to [her] relationships", then it is unclear which agent is exercising those powers. Even if the agent exercising them can be identified, it is certainly not clear that that agent is Meyers herself rather than a collective of which she is a part. And if those powers are exercised by a collective, then it is hard to see how the example is one of Meyers exercising the self-direction that "autonomy" connotes. Indeed, insofar as her restraint is motivated by worry about others' disapproval, it seems to be a clear example of heteronomous action. Furthermore, even if Meyers's restraint does have some claim to be called "autonomous", it is not clear that it exhibits the kind of autonomy that theorists of autonomy have traditionally been interested in. According to one school of thought, autonomy merits attention because it confers moral worth on our actions. Since actions which are self-regarding -- such as walking to safety and declining dessert -- do not obviously have the right kind of worth, they may lack the right kind of autonomy. And if the actions Meyers describes as autonomous are not autonomous after all, or if they are not autonomous in the right way, then she has not provided reason to accept her multi-self account of autonomy. At the very least, careful consideration of Meyers's essay shows just how widely intuitions about what acts are autonomous can differ and how those differences shape accounts of autonomy.

Rainer Forst says that someone acts autonomously when she acts as a "self-determining being." (230) He explains that someone acts as a self-determining being "when she acts intentionally and on the basis of reasons." (230) His association of autonomy with action on the basis of reasons suggests that he defends the view of autonomy that Meyers tries to attack and broaden. I implied that Meyers's criteria of autonomy are too weak, so that she counts too much conduct as autonomous. Forst's concept of autonomy is stronger and more traditional. Even though Forst does not count conduct as autonomous which arguably is not, I believe he needs to couple his concept of autonomy with other assumptions if that concept and its conceptions are to do the work he wants them to do.[1]

Immediately after saying that the autonomous agent acts intentionally and on the basis of reasons, Forst adds that "she is aware of the reasons for her action, can 'respond' when asked for her reasons and is thus 'responsible' for herself". (230) The immediacy with which Forst adds this last sentence suggests that he thinks awareness, the ability to respond and responsibility are all entailed by acting intentionally and on the basis of reasons, but it is not obvious that they are. The imputation of awareness is a particularly strong claim, at least if awareness of one's reasons requires something like explicit consciousness of them. Perhaps awareness is to be understood dispositionally, though in that case it would help to know what the imputation of awareness adds to the imputation of a capacity to respond when asked what one's reasons are.

Forst himself does not say any more about what he means by "awareness". Instead he asks about another of the conditions on autonomy, responsibility. To whom, he asks, are autonomous agents responsible? In answer, Forst distinguishes five kinds of contexts in which agents are accountable. What distinguishes these kinds of contexts are the kinds of reasons that count as good or justifying reasons within them. Because Forst thinks that agents are autonomous to the extent that they act on good reasons in a context (230), he thinks that the five kinds of reasons (and contexts) yield five kinds of autonomy. The five kinds are moral, ethical, legal, political and social autonomy. These five kinds of autonomy, Forst says, "are at the center of a concept of political liberty." (229) Since liberals value political liberty and since Forst thinks autonomy is at the center of liberty, Forst belongs among the philosophers I mentioned at the outset who think autonomy is -- in some way -- central to liberalism.

What does Forst have in mind when he says that the five kinds of autonomy are at the center of political liberty? Let me give just one example. Forst says that "in a moral context, a person can be called autonomous only if he or she acts on the basis of reasons … that are mutually justifiable." (230) He continues "[t]he basic liberties that will become part of positive law are those that morally responsible and autonomous agents cannot reasonably deny each other." (231) Forst therefore thinks that the basic liberties are liberties the denial of which cannot be supported by reasons which take everyone's interests properly into account. These liberties, Forst implies, are owed or possessed as a matter of "human rights" (231). Thus Forst thinks moral autonomy is central to political liberty in this sense: a central part of political liberty -- namely the liberty that people have as a matter of human rights -- is comprised of the liberty that morally autonomous agents could not deny one another.

But if I have read Forst correctly, then his account of human rights is too weak. It is hard to see how morally autonomous agents could reasonably deny one another trivial liberties, such as the liberty to wear fedoras rather than caps in cold weather. Yet such liberties, precisely because of their triviality, seem not to merit the honorific "human rights". If Forst wants to exploit the notion of moral autonomy to yield a partial list of human rights, he will have to ask what liberties morally autonomous agents could or could not reasonably deny each other when they have certain stipulated motivations or when they are choosing principles for a certain subject of justice, such as the basic structure. Simply asking what liberties they could or could not reasonably deny each other simpliciter seems to yield too inclusive an account of human rights. But Forst's view is complex and sophisticated. His essay, one suspects, condenses a much longer treatment that will eventually be spelled out elsewhere. Perhaps questions about his account of human rights are to be answered then.

Richard Dagger has long been on the forefront of the republican revival in political theory. His essay in Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism extends his contribution to the revival. In it, he argues for the possibility of a republican liberalism. This, he thinks, would be a political theory that is recognizably liberal but that successfully answers the challenge republicanism poses to liberal thought. Dagger seems, like Forst, to think that autonomy is central to liberalism. In saying that it is central, he does not mean -- as Forst seems to -- that an account of political liberty is to be derived from a complex account of autonomy. Rather, Dagger thinks that autonomy is something that liberal governments are supposed to promote. The republican challenge to liberalism, Dagger says, is the challenge to take the commitment to autonomy seriously. Dagger thinks that to be autonomous is to be self-governing (196). Republicanism's challenge, says Dagger, is the challenge to enhance citizens' government of their own lives rather than simply to allow it -- as Dagger says many liberal philosophers do -- by requiring only that people be left alone.

Dagger's challenge may tell against classical liberalism, though how far depends upon what self-government requires. But it would have been helpful to know how far Dagger thinks the challenge tells against Rawlsian liberalism, with its insistence on the difference principle, on providing the social bases of self-respect and on ensuring the fair value of the political liberties. Perhaps Dagger thinks that Rawls's liberalism is a species of republican liberalism.[2] If so, it would have been useful to see just where he would locate Rawls's debt to the republican tradition.

Jeremy Waldron's essay will be especially interesting to those who know other of the work he has produced in recent years, especially his critical work on Rawls. Rawls's theory is famously premised on what he calls "the fact of pluralism": the fact that modern liberal democracies are and will remain characterized by disagreement about the good. Waldron was one of the first to press hard on the facts that modern liberal democracies are characterized by disagreement about justice as well as disagreement about the good, and that that disagreement will persist even in ideal circumstances. What, he asked, are the implications for political philosophy -- in particular, for Rawlsian political philosophy -- if this is so? [3] In his contribution to this volume, Waldron continues to press this question, this time by exploring the possibility that disagreement about justice results from disagreement about the good.

Waldron begins his exploration with a distinction between personal and moral autonomy. Personal autonomy, Waldron says, is realized when someone is "in charge of his life." (307) Moral autonomy is realized when someone "is guided not just by his own conception of happiness but by universalized concern for the ends of all rational persons." (307) The distinction between the two forms of autonomy is one on which a number of philosophers, such as Joseph Raz, have insisted. But those who draw the distinction often disagree about which kind of autonomy is the more fundamental to liberalism. The kind of autonomy Dagger thinks liberals must promote seems to fit Waldron's description of personal autonomy. Gerald Gaus argues that moral autonomy is the more fundamental of the two in his contribution to Autonomy and the Challenges to Liberalism.

Rather than arguing that one or the other form of autonomy is central to liberalism, Waldron offers a number of arguments for blurring the distinction between the two (see 317). The argument that is most closely connected to his work on disagreement about justice begins from Raz's claim that "the proper use of autonomy is to choose between good options." (321) If this is so, Waldron says, "then it is hard to see how an unjust choice can be regarded as a genuine exercise of personal autonomy." (321) He continues immediately:

This means that in the exercise of one's personal autonomy, one may already be making judgments about justice. And it may follow in turn from that that each individual associates his personal autonomy with the criteria of justice that he uses in making these judgments. (321)

If the exercise of personal autonomy requires judgments of justice, then it requires judgments about how to we ought to show "universalized concern for the ends of all rational persons." In that case, Waldron thinks, the distinction between personal and moral autonomy will be hard to sustain. Furthermore, if personal autonomy is realized only through "engagement with the good" (320) and if it requires judgments of justice, then -- Waldron seems to imply -- the diversity of conceptions of the good will lead straightaway to a diversity of conceptions of justice.

But the most significant upshot of his argument, Waldron thinks, is not that a distinction on which some philosophers insist may be untenable. For once the connection between personal autonomy and disagreement about justice is driven home, Waldron thinks, the difficulty of getting people to put aside their own conceptions of justice and reach agreement on the right looms especially large. (see 325) In other words, what looms large is the difficulty of getting people to give a mutually acceptable conception of justice priority over the conception of justice that is associated with their views of the good -- the views with which personal autonomy is "engage[d]".

Why does Waldron think this? He says "the sharper the distinction between personal autonomy and moral autonomy, the more challenging it is to explain how this priority [of the right to the good] is supposed to work, for the more alien the requirements of morality will seem from the personal point of view." (308, emphasis added) Thus Waldron's worry seems to be that agents will identify with their own conceptions of justice and regard other conceptions -- perhaps, for example, Rawls's conception -- as alien impositions with which it will be hard for them to identify and by which they will be motivated with difficulty if at all.

There is no doubt a problem with getting people to lay aside conceptions of justice derived from, say, fundamentalist religiosity in order to accept liberal conceptions of justice. The question is how this problem is to be described. Waldron relies on the connotations of the word "personal" in the phrase "personal autonomy" to draw a contrast with what is "alien", so that he can describe the problem as one of getting people to accept a conception of justice whose origins are at some remove from them. But suppose Rawls is right to think that the motivation to act from a mutually acceptable conception of justice is connected with motives of reciprocity. Suppose, more specifically, that it stems from a desire to cooperate with others on mutually acceptable terms. And suppose, as Rawls seems to, that this is a desire that citizens of western liberal democracies all have. Then the problem of getting people to act from a mutually acceptable conception of justice is not that of getting them to comply with the demands of something or someone who is alien. It is the problem of getting them to identify more strongly with, and to act from the demands of, one part of themselves rather than another. It is the problem of getting them to identify with and act from the demands of that part of oneself that Rawls calls "the reasonable". Even those who insist on a distinction between personal and moral autonomy can, if they accept Rawlsian views of motivation, describe their problem this way rather than the way that Waldron does.

The problem of getting people to comply with a mutually acceptable conception of justice is a formidable one -- a real challenge to liberalism. Describing it correctly is just the first step toward addressing it. Even if the problem were overcome, it would not obviously follow that those who then identified with the reasonable and complied with its demands thereby realized something that merits the name "autonomy". It would not obviously follow even if they meet a condition on autonomy that, I said earlier, is largely unaddressed in this collection: the condition that they comply with principles of justice they would give themselves. For whether or not they would be autonomous does not depend only upon the authority of the principles with which they comply. It also depends upon why they comply with the principles and, hence, upon why they identify with the reasonable part of themselves.

Many citizens of modern societies have multiple and conflicting identities. They may well feel torn between the demands of the reasonable and the demands of more traditional conceptions of justice associated with their views of the good. If they choose the reasonable over their views of the good, but they do so from an impulse to conform to social or professional orthodoxy, then it is questionable whether they really are autonomous after all. If such citizens are not autonomous, then political philosophers who want citizens not simply to be liberals, but to be autonomous liberals, are defending a far more demanding view than is sometimes thought. In that case, perhaps we should speak -- not only of autonomy and the challenges to liberalism -- but also of autonomy and the challenges of liberalism. Challenges of both kinds are challenges about which readers will be provoked to think more deeply by many of the fine essays in this notable collection.

[1] Forst takes the distinction between a concept and its conceptions from John Rawls A Theory of Justice (Harvard University Press, 1999), pp. 8-9.

[2] See Richard Dagger Civic Virtues (Oxford University Press, 1997), p. 186.

[3] See Jeremy Waldron "Disagreements about Justice", Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 75 (1994): 372-87. For other work that takes up this question, see Paul Weithman Religion and the Obligations of Citizenship (Cambridge University Press, 2002) chapter 7 and Samuel Freeman "Public Reasons and Political Justifications", Fordham Law Review LXII (2004): 2021-72.