Autonomy and Trust in Bioethics

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O'Neill, Onora, Autonomy and Trust in Bioethics, Cambridge, 2002, 228pp, $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521894530.

Reviewed by Alan Thomas , University of Kent


This interesting and unusual work of philosophy offers a synoptic view of current practice in bioethics, from the point of view of a person who has made not only theoretical contributions to the field but also practical contributions. The author has been heavily involved, for many years, in the public regulatory regime of the United Kingdom concerning central areas of bioethics and this involvement clearly shapes some of the issues of this book.

O’Neill’s central concern is the paradox that recent bioethics has seen an increase in the safeguarding of individual autonomy and yet increasing public mistrust of the professionals and institutions centrally concerned with bioethical issues. Bioethics is understood broadly in this book as spanning both medical ethics and environmental ethics. While O’Neill is sensitive to the relevant differences between the two fields, she believes that the basic paradox that she identifies is exemplified in both. She is equally aware that it may have explanations grounded more in sociology than in moral philosophy, but this essay explores whether, in fact, there are good normative grounds for a trade-off between the safeguarding of autonomy and a desirably high level of trust. Has the philosophical emphasis on the importance of individual autonomy, centrally in medical ethics but in bioethics more widely, offered a philosophical rationale for a reduction in the extent to which people are prepared to trust? Are we, collectively, facing a trade-off between these two important values?

O’Neill claims that we need to clarify different conceptions of autonomy and trust such that we can choose whether or not to realize both values simultaneously or not. There is certainly a concept of autonomy, as a desirable feature of people identified reductively as their capacity for independence, that is inimical to relations of trust, in the sense that such individuals require a self-sufficient space of action which renders trusting relations with others largely redundant. But that is not an ethically particularly deep or interesting notion and O’Neill seeks to describe a more satisfactory conception. In the background here is O’Neill’s revisionary version of Kantianism. Kant’s immediate successors, particularly Hegel, were inclined to represent his practical philosophy as an empty formalism lacking social content and as the progenitor of a conception of the rational agent that is particularly ethically unattractive. That one-sided view of Kant’s achievement would point to a development in our ideas about freedom and autonomy which stripped away its evaluative context, leaving the willful and Luciferian individual criticized by, amongst others, Iris Murdoch. This work, in spite of its “applied” theme, can be seen as indirectly undermining any such view from the perspective of the Kantianism O’Neill has defended in earlier works. She argues that the idea of autonomy can hardly be intelligibly stated, let alone defended, without a context of choice and trust playing an important role in any such context.

O’Neill begins her analysis with a bracingly sceptical look at the importance given, in recent medical ethics, to the idea of autonomy. As she points out, the practical focus of this concern has been to increase the scope and demands of informed consent, with the philosophical rationale for this practice very much in the background. However, it is far from clear, O’Neill argues, how much informed consent actually delivers in the furtherance of an ethical ideal, as opposed to acting as a practical safeguard. People who are ill, who want treatment that will enable them to recover and who are choosing from a limited range of possible treatments described to them by those in charge of their treatment certainly do not seem to be exercising a Millian autonomous experiment in living. They are, rather, at the sharp end (no pun intended) of a medical system that increasingly presents itself to its consumers as an industrial process.

As O’Neill points out, where the ideal of autonomy has played a role is in philosophical rationale for “reproductive freedom”. Once again, however, faithfulness to the facts of different cases and sensitivity to different concepts going under the same name leads her to doubt whether the important concept of negative liberty that protects the private sphere of the individual, and a far more ethically ambitious notion of autonomy as akin to free self-expression, really ought to be classed together. She concedes that the former is an important notion, and protects such taken for granted (but hard won) freedom as that which people now enjoy when they plan the timing of having children. But O’Neill finds the latter concept very strained when it is placed at the service of arguments for a generalized “right to choose”. She points out, very perceptively, that once the issue is not the timing of childbirth but whether or not a particular person ought to exist, the introduction of a new person who is significantly dependent for a considerable period of time on its parents or appropriate surrogates makes appeals to a generalized ideal of reproductive freedom, modeled on free expression of one’s identity, ring hollow.

In search of a more philosophically defensible and ethically feasible notion of autonomy, O’Neill turns to Kant. Developing the arguments of her previous works, notably Towards Justice and Virtue, O’Neill argues that Kant’s central concept of autonomy does successfully steer between a dependence on a prior commitment to rationality as a constitutive value, or a collapse into undirected free choice. For that reason, Kant’s concept of autonomy can lead to the reasoned defence of certain central duties, such as a general duty not to coerce and a general duty not to deceive. In that way she argues that Kant’s approach can lead not simply to a defence of the limited, negative concept of autonomy as freedom from constraint but to a more defensible ethical concept of autonomy that is equally dependent on relations of mutual trust. Given O’Neill’s extensive treatment of these issues elsewhere and the aims of this particular book, it would be unfair to single out her defence of these claims as a weakness of this book. But the arguments do pass by rather quickly – at one point O’Neill describes her description of them as constituting a “freehand sketch” – and there is little here that will convince those unconvinced by her earlier arguments. I am happy to agree with her that there are some unconvincing reductive caricatures of Kant’s moral philosophy that need to be undermined, but less clear than O’Neill as to whether Kant’s actual views are entirely defensible and a completely satisfactory underpinning for the general duties of non-coercion and non-deception.

Those arguments set the scene for a general discussion of the nature of trustworthiness and the compatibility of O’Neill’s account of autonomy with a general account of trust. Following her methodological principle that Kant’s general obligations will require specification in historically specific institutional and political circumstances, complemented by the exercise of practical judgement, O’Neill describes a programmatic account of trustworthiness in biomedical ethics. Basically happy with the regulatory regime that structures these discussions in the United Kingdom she is, nonetheless, troubled by the combination of effective public regulation with a collapse in public trust. In a searching examination of the possible explanations of this state of affairs, O’Neill questions whether certain trends in public administration intended to further the cause of trustworthiness, the widespread use of auditing methods and an “agenda of openness”, have had the opposite effect. Citing the work of Michael Power, O’Neill endorses his conclusion that an audit culture actively undermines the very processes of trust that it sought to reinforce. (I suspect that this conclusion will be endorsed by those academics in the United Kingdom who have been on the receiving end of this particular trend in public administration applied to institutions of higher education.) Her criticism of the openness agenda is more indirect: it has, in her view, increased the trustworthiness of those in public life, but that is not the same as ensuring that they are in fact more trusted. These “top-down” efforts to enhance trustworthiness have not, in fact, led to increasing trust on the part of the public. The opposite has been the case, ironically very often in those areas of biomedical ethics that are most closely politically regulated (such as animal testing).

What is one to make of such public recalcitrance? O’Neill, a publicly engaged intellectual herself, responds by putting forward arguments that as it is impossible not to trust at all, it can be as damaging to suffer from misplaced mistrust as from misplaced trust. While placing trust in the untrustworthy can be directly damaging, there are also costs to a corrosive scepticism that trusts no-one, one is tempted to say, “on principle”. In fact, as O’Neill demonstrates, while the rhetoric surrounding such a crisis of public trust makes it look as though the educated public of the modern West have become seasoned experts in the hermeneutics of suspicion, they continue to trust, but “erratically and with reservations”. O’Neill reinforces this general point by re-iterating her basic argument: that the implementation of the kind of principled autonomy she derives from Kant will have to be complemented by attention to a social context of trust. Taking the example of the use of human tissue in medical research, she argues that emphasis on informed consent can hardly be sufficient without a more general contextualisation of these principles alongside the obligation not to deceive and the need for a context of trusting relations between medical professionals and those with whom they interact.

O’Neill understands that this remedy may have less application to those environmental and public health issues that have an impact on social groups rather than on identifiable individuals: issues, such as genetically modified food, characterized in the United Kingdom by a great deal of public mistrust would seem to fall outside the scope of O’Neill’s positive proposals. A political analogue of her ethical proposals might hope that democratic legitimation, or deliberation in the public sphere, may play a role analogous to that of informed consent in a context of trust at the level of individuals. But O’Neill is deeply sceptical about both proposals, worried that extant notions of democratic legitimation may fail to respect basic ethical norms and that broadcast and print media in the United Kingdom are in such a parlous state that their contribution to a notional public sphere of deliberation is nugatory. (O’Neill sees no reason, in drawing these pessimistic conclusions, to draw a distinction between private media corporations and the publicly funded British Broadcasting Corporation.) Her response, somewhat ironic, is an extension of public regulation of the media, justified if it improves the quality of communication. Corporate persons do not, O’Neill argues, have particularly robust rights of free expression, not when so many of them are in the business of confusing liberty with license. Their aim, rather, is communication, which is subject to the general obligations of non-coercion and non-deception and the more specific responsibility of allowing an audience to assess the truthfulness of claims put before it.

This is a thoughtful and conspicuously intelligent analysis, both of foundational philosophical issues about the basis of biomedical ethics, broadly conceived, and of the difficulties of implementing ethical principles through public legislation in a complex society characterized by various conspicuous market failures, principally, in the marketplace of ideas and their fair and accurate reporting by an increasingly commercialized media. (Increasingly commercialized in the sense that even publicly funded broadcasters in the United Kingdom have to demonstrate that they are delivering “value for money” precisely by competing with private commercial interests.) Three conspicuously optimistic assumptions underpin O’Neill’s essay: that a liberal public will respond to good arguments, that public administration can advance the public good, and that the blame for a crisis in public trust should be placed largely at the door of the media and not of its “consumers”.

This was not an easy book to write, spanning as it does issues in meta-ethics, normative ethics and practical issues concerned with social and institutional policy. O’Neill’s standing as a moral and political philosopher and as a contributor to the public regulatory regime in the United Kingdom have put her in a position to produce a book of interest to several distinct audiences. The delicate balance between philosophy and its “applications” is well managed in this work. This book will interest specialists working in moral and political philosophy who want to see the development of O’Neill’s version of Kantianism and specialists in the areas of medical and environmental ethics who want to see its “applications”. Unusually for a work of philosophy, there is material here of considerable interest to those outside the academy, ranging from the relevant professional disciplines of medicine and public administration to the media. All in all this is an engaging and distinguished book that may, unlike most books of moral philosophy, do some good in the world by advancing the understanding of pressing and important ethical issues.