Autonomy, Gender, and Politics

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Friedman, Marilyn, Autonomy, Gender, and Politics, Oxford, 2003, 272pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195138511.

Reviewed by Catriona Mackenzie, Macquarie University


The ideal of autonomy has been criticized by feminist philosophers on grounds ranging from claims that autonomy promotes character ideals such as independence and self-sufficiency that historically have been associated with masculinity and social privilege, through to claims that the ideal assumes the existence of a metaphysically dubious true self. One prominent charge is that the notion of autonomy is excessively individualistic and that ideals of autonomy ignore the social dimensions of selfhood and the importance of relationships and community to agents’ identities. Relational approaches to autonomy have developed in response to these kinds of charges. Briefly, relational theories are motivated by two interrelated concerns. The first is to explore the implications of the social dimensions of agency and identity for theories of autonomy. Thus relational theorists have focused attention on the ways in which agents’ self-conceptions, values and beliefs, are shaped by the social environment and on the contributory role of that environment to the capacities and competences necessary for autonomy. The second concern is to demonstrate the value of autonomy for agents who are subject to oppressive social relationships and institutions and to analyze the ways in which oppressive socialization can impair agents’ autonomy.

Autonomy, Gender, Politics makes an important and challenging contribution to the development of relational approaches to autonomy and to the ongoing debate about how best to articulate a relational approach. The debate centres on two issues. One is whether relational theorists should endorse a content-neutral or a more substantive account of autonomy. Content-neutral, or procedural, approaches stipulate that an agent is autonomous with respect to her motivations, values, or choices just so long as these have been subjected to appropriate critical scrutiny, irrespective of their substantive content. Proponents of substantive approaches charge that the constraints on critical reflection required by content-neutral theories are insufficient to distinguish autonomous from non-autonomous reflection. Substantive approaches thus propose a range of substantive constraints on the content of an autonomous agent’s choices, beliefs, values and motivations. The other, connected, issue is whether sociality or relationality should be understood as merely causal or whether it should be understood as constitutive. In brief, is autonomy social just in the sense that human selfhood is social and the social environment provides the necessary causal conditions for the development of autonomy competence? Or is autonomy constitutively social? One way of articulating this claim would be to argue that autonomy is inconsistent with social relationships that subordinate an agent to the will of others. Another way of articulating the claim would be to argue that the reflective capacities necessary for autonomy are intrinsically social.

Friedman presents a powerful defence of a content-neutral approach to autonomy that is relational in the causal, rather than the constitutive, sense. Two themes recur throughout the discussion and emerge as central to her account of autonomy. The first is the idea that the value of autonomy is grounded in the value of an agent’s first-person perspective or her perspectival identity. Thus she suggests that ’an ideal of personal autonomy is based on the presumption that there is value in a life lived in accord with the perspective of the one who lives it’ (p. 56). Friedman characterizes perspectival identity in terms of an agent’s deeper wants, values and concerns; her perspectival identity is an expression of who she is and what matters most to her. The capacity for autonomy is the capacity to reflect on one’s wants, values and commitments and to be able to make this reflection effective in practical deliberation and action. An agent is autonomous just so long as she can engage in this kind of reflection free from coercion and manipulation and can act in accordance with her deeper concerns or her perspectival identity, despite some degree of opposition by others. The centrality of the first-person perspective to Friedman’s account of autonomy explains the emphasis she places on the importance of individuality. Although Friedman’s approach to autonomy is relational, she argues nevertheless that since each person is a separately embodied being, with a distinct identity and life narrative, autonomy is crucially bound up with individuality and individuation; it is about shaping a life of one’s own, expressing one’s distinctive individual identity. The more autonomous an agent is, the more distinctively individual she is.

The second crucial theme in Friedman’s discussion is the recognition that our individual identities, and the values and concerns that we regard as expressive of who we are, are shaped by our social situation and by significant social relationships. Further, our very capacities for reflection are themselves developed in a social environment that may foster and encourage the development of those capacities or undermine and thwart them. These factors do not undermine the possibility of autonomy, in Friedman’s view. So long as an agent reflectively endorses her choices, values and concerns, however they arose, she is autonomous with respect to them. However, these factors do draw attention to the causal, or contributory, role of the social environment in the development of autonomy competence.

The book is divided into four sections. In the first section, comprising the first three chapters, Friedman develops her content-neutral account of autonomy and defends the coherence of the concept of autonomy against a variety of charges. She also argues that personal autonomy is a precondition of moral competence, and stresses its importance for women in providing a normative standpoint from which oppressive social relationships, norms and practices can be criticized. Although much of the material discussed in this section covers ground that will be familiar to those versed in the literature on autonomy, these chapters provide a clear and engaging overview of the central debates. Further, Friedman’s contribution to the debate is sufficiently distinctive and controversial to be of interest to theorists of autonomy. I found the discussion in Chapter Three of the centrality of the first-person perspective to autonomy and of the connection between personal autonomy and moral competence particularly thought provoking.

The second and third sections of the book, comprising chapters four through seven, focus on the social and relational dimensions of autonomy and seek to answer the following kinds of question: In what ways are social relationships necessary for autonomy? What kinds of relationships promote personal autonomy and what kinds of relationships undermine it? Is autonomy a potential catalyst for disrupting social bonds, and if so is this always a bad thing? In answering these questions, Friedman advances two main claims. The first is that feminists have been correct to emphasize the importance of personal ties and of wider social networks to agents’ identities. Further, acknowledging the social grounding of identity is not inconsistent with valuing personal autonomy. However, and this is the second claim, some social relationships are inimical to autonomy. For example, romantic love relationships in which one person’s needs, desires and goals are always, or usually, given priority over the needs, desires and goals of their partner may seriously compromise the autonomy of that partner. Similarly, many physically and/or psychologically abusive intimate personal relationships subject the victims of abuse to a degree of control and intimidation by another that is incompatible with autonomy.

The fourth section, comprising chapters eight and nine, locates personal autonomy within the broader context of political liberalism. I found the discussion in Chapter Eight of the paradoxes within liberal conceptions of political legitimacy concerning the political coercion of unreasonable people somewhat tangential to the concerns of the rest of the book. However, Friedman’s discussion of the implications of her account of autonomy for important questions of social policy is one of the book’s main strengths. In Chapter Seven she focuses on the fraught issue of what the response of the law and professional caregivers should be to women who will not leave, or press charges against, their abusive partners. Chapter Nine discusses the difficult and topical issue of how liberal societies should respond to minority cultural practices that violate the rights of women and girls. Friedman’s response to both issues centers on the claim that respect for autonomy involves respect for the first-person perspective of agents. In relation to domestic abuse, she argues that legal policy ought to be driven by the aim of reducing domestic violence in the population as a whole. The law should, therefore, mandate proceedings against abusers, even if the woman who has been abused does not wish to cooperate with legal proceedings. Professional caregivers, in contrast, should provide uncritical support for whatever choice a woman makes in such a situation, rather than attempting to persuade her to leave an abusive relationship. In relation to cultural practices that violate women’s rights, Friedman’s argument is that such practices are permissible if the women in question consent to them.

Friedman is of course well aware that agents who are subject to oppressive socialization can consent to institutions, practices and relationships that undermine their flourishing. This is why the two cases she considers pose significant challenges for social policy. However it seems to me that her hands-off response to both cases reveals a tension within her approach between her minimal interpretation of the requirements for content-neutral autonomy and her claim that autonomy is valuable in providing a normative standpoint from which to criticize oppressive social institutions, practices and relationships. On the one hand, she argues that the threshold for autonomous critical reflection should be minimal, such that ’practically any self-reflective reaffirmation will do’ (p. 7). Further, the default assumption should be that all agents are competent, autonomous decision-makers whose judgments about the choices that are best for them should be regarded as trustworthy. In this respect, her interpretation of content-neutrality is considerably less demanding than the constraints on autonomous critical reflection required by most procedural theorists. On the other hand, she suggests that ’autonomy promotes in individuals a greater degree of critical reflection on traditional norms and customary practices and that this reflection gives individuals greater opportunity to recognise norms that are harmful to them’ (p. 70). This kind of normative social critique, however, seems to assume quite stringent constraints on adequate critical reflection.

Friedman would argue, in response, that autonomy is a matter of degree and that the requirements for autonomy can, therefore, be more or less stringent. Her objections to the more stringent requirements of substantive conceptions of autonomy are twofold. First, she argues that such accounts require a substantive commitment to the value of autonomy itself. However, agents can be autonomous without endorsing the value of autonomy. Second, accepting a lower threshold for autonomy is more likely to promote respect for others’ first-person perspectives. While I agree that autonomy is a matter of degree, I was somewhat perplexed by Friedman’s interpretation of substantive conceptions. Most substantive conceptions require either that autonomous agents possess certain psychological characteristics, such as a sense of self-worth or capacities for self-trust, or stipulate normative competence – the capacity to reflect on and question social norms and practices – as a condition of autonomy. Friedman herself seems to waver between the weaker content-neutral account of reflection she explicitly endorses and a stronger, substantive, normative competence account to which she implicitly appeals in her claims about the value of autonomy in enabling agents to question and resist oppressive norms and institutions. In addition, I was unpersuaded by Friedman’s claims that more demanding accounts of autonomy may risk treating others who do not meet the requirements for autonomy as unworthy of respect. If autonomy is a matter of degree there may be good reason to accept a low threshold for autonomy when it comes to political citizenship, and the rights and liberties it guarantees, including the right not be treated paternalistically. However, if one of the values of an ideal of personal, as opposed to political, autonomy is that it can provide a normative standpoint for criticizing oppressive or manipulative social structures, there are good reasons to require a more demanding account of the conditions for autonomous reflection.

Autonomy, Gender, Politics makes a major contribution to the philosophical literature on autonomy and gender. Whether or not one is ultimately persuaded by her content-neutral account of autonomy, Friedman’s discussion of the philosophical and social policy issues raised by a relational approach to autonomy is illuminating, challenging and insightful.