Autonomy in Jewish Philosophy

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Seeskin, Kenneth, Autonomy in Jewish Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2001,xii + 255 pp, $54.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-521-80037-4.

Reviewed by Michael L. Morgan, Indiana University


From a philosophical point of view, there may be no more central problem for Jewish philosophy and Jewish theology of the postwar period than the problem of autonomy. In the 1950s and early 1960s there were numerous attempts, especially on the part of liberal and non-traditional Jewish thinkers, to come to grips with the apparent conflict between traditional authority grounded in divine command and individual freedom or autonomy. I am thinking of theologians such as Jakob Petuchowski, Lou Silberman, Bernard Martin, Eugene Borowitz, and Emil Fackenheim. Later the very same issue was raised by orthodox or traditional theologians, for instance by David Hartman, for whom the attractions of individual freedom took longer to take hold. Seeskin’s book is a rationalist response to this problem.

Seeskin’s book is about Judaism and largely about Jewish conduct. Moreover, it is about rationality and the central role that reason plays in Jewish life. Sometimes Seeskin is interested in the role of reason in knowing God and theological truths, but most often he is concerned about the role of practical reason in knowing what one is to do and how one is to live. Basically he argues that Judaism – as expressed in the Bible and in rabbinic literature, and as interpreted by Maimonides and Cohen, among others – should be understood as a set of rational principles for living that are grounded in God, have a claim on Jews and in some cases only on Jews, and are autonomous because they are rational. In addition to Maimonides and Cohen, who are conduits for Aristotle and Kant into Judaism, Seeskin also discusses Spinoza and Moses Mendelssohn. Spinoza should be contrasted with Maimonides, who is less extreme and hence provides an account of the religious life that is within Judaism and not opposed to it. Mendelssohn should be contrasted with Cohen, who is more consistent in his rationalism. Once he shows how Judaism as a rational religion should be interpreted along the lines of Maimonides and Cohen, Seeskin turns briefly to Martin Buber and Emmanuel Levinas as critics of this rationalism. He registers their objections, as he sees them, and then responds to them, in the end arguing for a type of covenantal account of Judaism and the relation between the divine and the human, the content of which is rational, ethical, and autonomous.

At the outset Seeskin tells us that “this is a book I have wanted to write ever since I began to think about Jewish philosophy in a serious way” (ix). I can see why. It is a book that cherishes human freedom and self-determination or what, to use the analogy of social-contract theory, we call consent. It also takes Judaism seriously enough not to erase its sense of obligation or duty. This is a book for modern philosophers or people with the sensibility of modern philosophy who still want to acknowledge the “seriousness” or bindingness of Jewish practice and life. It is a book for people who find the dilemma compelling and who find grabbing either horn to be one-sided or deflationary. And for what it is, Seeskin’s book is excellent. I would say that it very well may be the best single book on the subject. It is clear, well-argued, deep, and fair. Seeskin knows Maimonides, Spinoza, Kant, Cohen, Mendelssohn, and the other figures whom he writes about. His readings are marked by accuracy and understanding. This is not a fine-grained probing of texts or arguments; it is a very responsible and honest philosophical engagement with the thinkers and the issues. And Seeskin is consistent and careful. His understanding fits together and the ultimate picture he gives, of a Judaism based on a covenantal relation between God and persons, on the rationality of Judaism, and on personal autonomy, is coherent and, to some, it will be compelling.

Various historical figures would not have agreed with Seeskin’s rational portrait of Jewish life and belief. I doubt, for example, that all the Jewish intellectuals during the rabbinic period were rationalists, and later figures like Halevi, Nachmanides, and Crescas surely were not. Nor were those who wrote within the Kabbalistic tradition, at least not in the sense of rationalist that Seeskin develops. But, like him, I would have to say that a more important challenge for Seeskin and his rational tradition, as he understands it, comes from modern thinkers, who, after the later Schelling, Kierkegaard, and Nietzsche, attempt to meet the challenge of Enlightenment rationalism and liberalism head on. Seeskin certainly admits that the challenge exists, and his discussion of Buber and Levinas is intended to formulate and refute it.

Let me say something about Seeskin as an interpreter of the history of philosophy and the history of Jewish philosophy. First, Seeskin is definitely a philosophical reader of these traditions. He is not an intellectual historian who tells the story, so to speak, but a philosopher who interprets by thinking through the issues and arguments, clearly formulating them, and then addressing them critically. In fact, he is outstanding at this, and it is clear how well he understands and has assimilated the thinking of the figures he discusses. Nor does Seeskin stand at such a distance from these figures that he ignores what they have said and just paraphrases them. He knows what they have said, has examined the texts carefully, and has his own interpretation of what they are doing. All this is to the good. One might worry, nonetheless, that Seeskin is standing a bit too far from the texts and figures themselves and a bit too far from the precise sense of what they are doing and why. In the case of Mendelssohn, for example, Seeskin is happy to read Jerusalem as a response to Spinoza and to Maimonides, but he never so much as suggests that Mendelssohn had changed his views about Spinoza from his earliest writings, or that Mendelssohn was, in 1783, as concerned about the fate of natural theology and Wolffian rationalism as he was about either Spinoza or Maimonides and as concerned too about the fideism of Jacobi and the whole issue of the purported Spinozism and atheism of his friend Lessing. To understand the extent of Mendelssohn’s rationalism and its significance for Judaism, one must understand his antipathy toward Jacobi’s anti-rationalism and the impact of all of these contexts as well as the larger, overarching Jewish ones.

When Seeskin turns to Buber, I think, his historical distance is a much more serious defect. Buber is, from very early in his career, influenced by thinkers as diverse and yet as similar as Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Simmel, and Dilthey. His thinking is also significantly shaped by his friend and mentor Gustav Landauer, by his attachment to Zionism as a Jewish renewal movement, and by his passionate involvement with mystical traditions and writings. All of this contributes to his lectures and writings of the years just before and after World War I and then to the shift that leads him to . and Thou. Later, after the war, his thinking develops and is modified and clarified. Seeskin quotes from early writings and later ones, without distinguishing them, their contexts, and their content. This should make any reader suspicious of his results, which appear stylized and conventional rather than historically and philosophically precise and nuanced. Furthermore, even if we were to allow the eliding of texts from the 1920s and the 1950s, as if they did in fact share precisely the same views and positions, we should not be so forgiving about treating the Buber of . and Thou as someone responding to the views of Sartre and French existentialism. It was ten years after the publication of Buber’s book that Sartre became acquainted with Husserl’s work, studied in Germany, and began to develop his own philosophical views as a response to Husserl and to Heidegger. It makes more sense to read Buber in his own world, in terms of Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, Bergson, Simmel, Dilthey, and others, including not so much Kant as the Neo-Kantians, primarily the Southwestern school of Windelband and Rickert and not primarily the Marburg school represented by Cohen. Buber was indeed interested in the centrality of ethics and values, for example, but not in Cohen’s sense, as a form of knowledge and then action, as much as in the sense of Windelband and Rickert and those who sought to distinguish historical, or what we might call existential, thinking as interpretive and involved with meaning and value and the lives of those who live according to those meanings. In short, Buber’s thinking is deeply hermeneutical.

Probably the most important challenge that Seeskin levels against Buber concerns the vacuousness of his ethics or, as he puts it, the criteria of authenticity. On Seeskin’s reading of the rational Jewish tradition, ethical laws are autonomous and divinely grounded, and ritual commands are functional, somehow serving the ultimate goal of moral conduct. Both have precise content. Buber, on Seeskin’s reading, seems to ground ethics in the divine-human encounter, the I-Thou, which is momentary, detached from everyday life, and ineffable. What direction can such a moment of dialogue provide? And notice too how such an episodic view of revelation and religious experience denigrates all ritual actions and practices as impediments to genuine dialogue. Buber’s contrast between the I-It and the I-Thou, as Seeskin argues, makes the content of the I-Thou, if it has any content, irrelevant. And since the experience is unique and wholly particular, how can it yield a universal or general content, a duty or obligation? Seeskin argues that Buber and those like him simply cannot answer this question.

Technically speaking, Seeskin might be right. Buber does claim that the religious person, whose life is oriented by moments of dialogue, does not relate to others in terms of rules or principles:

Of course, whoever steps before the countenance has soared way beyond duty and obligation – but not because he has moved away from the world; rather because he has come truly close to it. Duties and obligations one has only toward the stranger: toward one’s intimates one is kind and loving. When a man steps before the countenance, the world becomes wholly present to him for the first time in the fullness of the presence …. He is not rid of responsibility… he has exchanged … the power of loving responsibility for the whole unexplorable course of the world…. Ethical judgments, to be sure, he has left behind forever …. but decisions he must continue to make in the depths of spontaneity unto death – calmly deciding ever again in favor of right action (. and Thou, 156-157).

Buber is here describing how different his view of the divine-human encounter is from Kierkegaard’s. For him, the religious person lives in the world; the moment of encounter with the Eternal Thou is also a moment of loving responsibility toward the other person. It occurs in the world, in life, and its impact is in life. The encounter makes life “heavy with meaning,” and “the meaning we receive can be put to the proof in action only by each person in the uniqueness of his being and in the uniqueness of his life. No prescription can lead us to the encounter, and none leads from it” (ibid., 158-159). What leads from it is a direction or orientation, a commitment to loving responsibility toward the other person.

In his earlier writings, for example in his essay “Ecstasy and Confession” of 1909, Buber had described the relation between the “fullness” of such an experience and subsequent action as the relation between a mystical experience and testimony to it. There he treated the experience as a fire within the soul, as a kind of overabundance or overflow, and the testimony as a kind of expression of it, its emanation, as it were. By 1922, Buber is less inclined to use mystical language, given his criticism of mysticism, but the relation might be thought to be similar, a kind of expression or manifestation of the fullness of the experience. The encounter is “meaning-giving” and the subsequent action is “meaningful”, despite the fact that the former has no prescriptive content. Although Buber does not use exactly these words, we might say that the action is in part the agent’s interpretation of what the encounter means for the agent; it is self-expressive as self-articulating. Famously, Franz Rosenzweig criticized Buber’s dichotomy between I-It and I-Thou precisely because Buber failed to clarify the relation between them, between creation, revelation, and redemption. Another way of putting this would be to say that Buber is not as clear as he should be about how the divine revelation to the person in the world leads to certain human relationships with others in the world, as a human exemplification of divine love.

Buber’s thinking may not be without its own problems, but, I would contend, the problem that Seeskin sees is not one of them. I think that Buber takes Enlightenment rationalism as too limited and narrow to acknowledge what is genuinely the religious event. Or, to put this point in other terms, ones closer to Rosenzweig perhaps, nature or reason, on their own, can never provide an absolute ground of meaning and purpose for human life. If all is ultimately reducible to nature or if all is ultimately reducible to the rational subject, then ethical objectivity is attenuated, with the risk of skepticism, some kind of relativism, or even nihilism. Only transcendence can secure the good absolutely, and access to it requires some kind of experience, artistic or mystical or whatever, and what Charles Taylor calls an epiphany of the source of the good. Given that epiphany, moreover, the question of how it yields human action in behalf of the good and some understanding of what that goodness means is a question of hermeneutics.

Seeskin’s account, his rationalism, is hermeneutically opaque. Focusing on rationality, whether of an Aristotelian or Kantian variety, occludes the primacy of the particular individual’s point of view and replaces it instead with a “view from nowhere.” For this reason, Seeskin misses the hermeneutical dimension of Buber and Rosenzweig. For them, the meaning-giving experience does not occur in a historical vacuum or in total abstraction from the world. It occurs for an individual who stands within one or more communities, one or more traditions, and within a complex historical situation. And what follows is life within that complexity, in part interpreted in terms of all that the subject understands in terms of the past and her world and in part interpreted in response to the sensed impact of the epiphantic moment. A great deal depends, for the subject’s interpretation, on her understanding of who she is, where she is, and so forth. Her choices, actions, and life subsequent to the event express her experience, manifest what it means, in a sense, in the only way that that can happen. There is no such thing as a secret, private, subjective experience other than what is expressed and lived in the world subsequent to it.

After discussing Buber, Seeskin turns to Emmanuel Levinas, whose thinking he describes and then, in the end, sets aside. Seeskin senses that a major problem with understanding Levinas has to do with grasping precisely what Levinas is doing. Is he describing everyday experience or is he doing something else? This question is critical to everything that Seeskin says about Levinas and critical too to understanding Levinas at all. It is a mistake to treat Levinas as offering a kind of alternative to Buber and his concept of dialogue. To Levinas, dialogue is a genuine feature of everyday life, along with experience and use, the primary modes of what Buber calls I-It relations. Levinas’s conception of the face-to-face relation and of the self as responsibility are not alternatives to Buber’s I-Thou encounter. Levinas is not offering an alternative philosophical anthropology. Rather Levinas’s phenomenological account is a transcendental enterprise akin to those of Kant and Husserl and even Heidegger, although, if he is right, it is deeper than theirs and quite distinctive. Perhaps the most noteworthy features of Levinas’s results are that the transcendental conditions for everyday human life – ethical, political, religious, and theoretical – are ethical or normative in a fundamental way, that they are not subjective conditions although they involve a very distinctive notion of subjectivity, that they are not general conditions but unique events, and that they involve a non-imperialistic relation with the human other. The outcome of Levinas’s often obscure probing of these conditions, of the face to face encounter and the self’s primordial responsibility, is a kind of obligatoriness or burden that each person has for everyone else, infinitely and unconditionally. In everyday life, this obligatoriness manifests itself in our theoretical and practical lives; in fact, Levinas tries to show that all of our life is grounded somehow or other, directly or indirectly, in this original phenomenon. And since it is in a sense prior to all thought and language, as manifest in everyday life and reflection based on it, this domain or phenomenon cannot ever be described literally but only indicated, elicited, and hinted at using language not strictly speaking appropriate to it. Moreover, insofar as this primordial condition or phenomenon involves a self engaged with an other, responsible to it and burdened by it, the self is indeed defined by a kind of passivity or heteronomy. Levinas is explicit about this. But he is just as explicit that this passivity is “beyond all passivity” and that this heteronomy is the birth of a new autonomy and freedom. In short, the self that is responsible is not coerced or forced, but it is fundamentally other-oriented and responsible in every possible way. To clarify how radical Levinas intends this conception of the self, which he only begins to explore late in his career, in the late 1960s and in Otherwise Than Being, we might compare it with the way that some utilitarians have argued that the self’s kinship with and allegiance to other selves should be considered a stronger reason for moral conduct than the self’s exclusivist identification with its own future states. There is something analogous to this going on in Levinas, although at a different level of philosophical reflection.

Hence, it is false, strictly speaking, to call Levinas’s ethics heteronomous. It is also false to see his face to face as an alternative to Buber’s I-Thou. The latter is one of two modes of everyday experience; Levinas’s face to face is a structure and normative fact that underlies both the I-Thou and the I-It, as it were, and provides a standard of aspiration for both. Human relations, actions, institutions, and more are or are not genuinely human to the degree that they manifest the responsibility that grounds all of human experience.

Arguably one of the personal and philosophical motives behind Levinas’s moral and religious challenge to Heidegger’s ontology and to the tradition of totalization in Western philosophy has to do with the Holocaust. His own testimony informs us that it was Nazism and Heidegger’s association with it that initially turned him into a critic of Heidegger. And the development of his own views, after the war and beyond, is linked to his sensitivity to the suffering of the victims of Nazism. Still, Levinas’s thinking, I would contend, is not deeply historical. It is a kind of foundationalism and a response to historicism.

Seeskin’s account of Judaism as autonomous and rational is, we might say, a pre-Holocaust foundationalism or a post-Holocaust return to a pre-Holocaust Enlightenment. Levinas’s philosophy and his view of Judaism as testimony to human suffering, the failures of human responsibility, and as an expression of the teaching of the primacy of the ethical are a post-Holocaust foundationalism. Both can be viewed as expressions of a common concern, a common fear, that the lack of normative foundations for human thinking and human conduct run the risk of another Nazism, another Fascism, and another Holocaust. What both leave open is a further option, one that I can only call attention to here and not discuss, that for us, as human beings living in the world, historical situatedness is inescapable and absolute foundations or standards impossible. Our task is not to return to pre-Holocaust rationalisms or to discover new post-Holocaust foundationalisms; it is to come to grips with the historicity of our identities and yet to persevere with nobility and hope. By keeping faithfully and clearly to his task, Seeskin exposes this challenge, which is the one that I believe is the deepest one for those of us who live after the horrors of the twentieth century.