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Andrew Sneddon, Autonomy, Bloomsbury, 2013, 219pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441165015.

Reviewed by Nomy Arpaly, Brown University


Autonomy is not a thick book but it is, to use an expression I learned from my students, "action-packed". At the heart of the book is Andrew Sneddon's moral-psychological theory of autonomy. The most novel view he defends concerns justified paternalism. Sneddon also has views on political liberalism, determinism, abortion, situationism, authenticity, the sources of human motivation, assisted suicide, advertising, the extended mind, and more. In addition to the many original views and arguments, Sneddon wishes to provide students with an introduction to autonomy. I think he tries to accomplish too many things in a small space, and I would make a similar error if I attempted a comprehensive summary here. I will sketch the theory of autonomy in the center of the book and its main tie to paternalism. I will also demonstrate the pervasive lack of precision that haunts the book.

But first, I must mention a problem Sneddon faces that other theorists face as well. "What is personal autonomy?" (or, "what is individual self-rule"?) is a strange question. Though some of the "folk" praise autonomy -- meaning something like freedom from coercion, especially the paternalistic sort -- the term 'autonomy' as used by moral psychologists is a technical term, and so is their 'self-rule'. Non-philosophers sometimes attribute the following to people: rationality, responsibility (or being to blame), self-control, independence, free will -- never autonomy or self-rule (at least not using the terms 'autonomy' or 'self rule'). This does not stop Sneddon from trying to characterize autonomy or self-rule primarily through appeals to pre-theoretical intuitions about autonomy and self-rule, which should tell us which of the people in his (many, detailed!) examples are more autonomous than others.

Do we have such intuitions? Even technical terms have connotations, and so a slave "sounds" less autonomous than a master. But natural language cannot tell us, for instance, if the terms 'autonomy' and 'self-rule' refer to something resembling self control -- which slaves can have in abundance -- or to something resembling control over one's life, which slaves (mostly) lack. Sneddon needs to decide how to use the terms -- whether a chronically weak-willed master could ever count as less autonomous than someone of perfect integrity forced to be a slave. He never quite does, and I wonder if he would have been more careful if he were not under the impression that we just know self-rule when we see it.

Sneddon starts with what he calls autonomy of choice (which he later contrasts with autonomy of persons). He introduces the naïve reader to the "hierarchical" view of autonomy -- at breakneck speed. Here is how he describes one version of the position:

Having a specific sort of desire about another desire makes the second desire autonomous. For example, interpretations of Harry Frankfurt's position on persons and freedom of the will in terms of autonomy emphasize what he calls 'volitions', which are desires that a certain desire be one's will, that is, that it be effective in bringing about action. (p. 20)

This is Sneddon's summary of Frankfurt's view quoted in full. It will simply not do for the undergraduate reader. Sneddon's introductions to other famous things, like coherentism and parts of Kant, are similarly too brief.

Sneddon agrees that second-order desires, plans and various other higher order mental states make choices autonomous. He does not think autonomous choice requires explicit reasoning. He often refers to all mental states as "thoughts", which might be the cause of the following mix-up:

Consider the thought 'I want all of my thoughts to be held to the strictest of logical standards'. Since it applies to all of one's thinking this thought applies to itself, meaning that from it we can derive the more specific 'I want that my thought 'I want all my thoughts to be held to the strictest of logical standards' is [sic] held to the strictest of logical standards'. The desire expressed in the original thought is self-endorsing -- one cannot coherently feel the pull of this desire without really having it, so the question 'Do I really want to hold my thoughts to the strictest logical standards?' is automatically answered. (p. 33)

Note that having the thought "I want that my all my thoughts be held to the strictest of logical standards" does not entail "really" having the desire -- or having it at all. I can think, in a self-flattering way, that I want all my thoughts to be held to the strictest of logical standards, but in fact lack any desire to scrutinize some cherished beliefs of mine. Furthermore, the desire, when it exists, cannot endorse itself, because it is not about itself -- it concerns thoughts, which are different from desires. Arguably, even a desire that all my mental states be held to the strictest of logical standards does not endorse any of them -- and hence is not self-endorsing. Finally: have you ever felt "the pull" of a desire to hold all your mental states to the strictest of logical standards and, asking yourself if you "really" wanted to, decided to avoid this kind of perfectionism like the plague?

Sneddon turns to the autonomy of persons. What makes a person autonomous is not simply making autonomous choices but rather her exercise of "self-shaping", which requires self-knowledge to be done well. As part of self-shaping, the autonomous person actively examines his mental states in the light of his values. Yes, he does it often and, yes, he does it through explicit reasoning. If he discovers a problem with, say, a desire, he "gives up on" the desire or modifies his values. Sneddon never says if "giving up on" a desire is making it disappear somehow or merely a successful resolve to suppress it. To be autonomous, we must also choose -- preferably on a regular basis -- our values themselves. Sneddon assures us that this is not self-creation -- making something out of nothing -- but rather something like creating a pot out of clay. However, if the lump of clay we shape includes our values, it is unclear who is doing the shaping -- what values guide us in our choice of values.

Sneddon presents self-shaping as "egocentric" (his term). An egocentric choice is "about" the self in the same way a choice to groom a cat is "about" the cat. Though a decision to commit murder might change you profoundly, it is not egocentric. The self-shaper must introspect, deliberate about her mental states, and intentionally change herself. Sneddon later argues that self-shaping choices are important because human selves are important and self-shaping choices concern human selves. A fact that escapes Sneddon's attention is this: many cases of changing one's values -- even through explicit reasoning! -- fail to qualify as self-shaping on his model. Imagine that Sally, through explicit reasoning, concludes that eating meat is wrong and chooses to avoid eating meat. It is easy to imagine the following: Sally reaches her conclusion and makes her choice without ever introspecting or examining her mental states, nor does her choice require self-knowledge to be a good one, though it might require understanding the main arguments for and against eating meat. The decision is not "about her", and the importance of the decision does not hang on the value of selves like hers but on the moral status of nonhuman animals. It is easy to forget that Sneddon's talk throughout the book about self-shaping -- as when he says self-shaping is extremely important -- is not about choices such as Sally's but only about intentional tinkering with one's mental states.

Sneddon veers too easily between talk of shaping one's self and talk of shaping one's life (and then there is also talk of deciding how to live). Shaping one's self and shaping one's life are different. A decision to buy a house shapes your life but is not, by Sneddon's own lights, self-shaping. On the other hand, self-shaping only requires that your "self" yields to you, whereas life-shaping requires collaboration from the world. The trouble with saying that autonomy requires life-shaping is that it is strange to say that my autonomy decreases every time things fail to go my way. The trouble with saying it does not is that it is strange to say that slaves can be autonomous. Though Sneddon never promises that good self-shaping is sufficient for autonomy, he never decides whether autonomy requires things going your way. Often he speaks as if the answer is "no". However, the autonomous people in his examples have successful careers. They often own businesses.

Choosing one's values benefits from being aware of many possible values and ways of life. Thus living in a cosmopolitan city can increase your autonomy, whereas living in a far-away village can limit the degree of autonomy you achieve. Not just being introspective, but being educated also helps with self-shaping. When you add to that Sneddon saying that exposure to advertising reduces your autonomy -- should you avoid television? -- you get a rather elitist view of autonomous persons.

A problem occurs whenever Sneddon's subsequent arguments call for a more, shall we say, down-to-earth concept of autonomy. For example, when he argues for the intrinsic value of autonomy he wants to convince us that almost everybody values it. As evidence he points out the way most people abhor being slaves and the seemingly irreversible turn away from paternalism in doctor-patient relationships. Much evidence suggests that people detest coercion and manipulation and value their absence. But do they value self-shaping and self-knowledge? I would guess many of them never give a thought to whether their values or even desires are the result of self-shaping. Also, by Sneddon's own admission, self-shaping sounds exhausting. Some people praise "going with the flow", "living in the now" or "not thinking too much". Others want their selves shaped not by their own mental labor but by God alone, through faith. Some regard exposure to many ways of life as a pointless spiritual risk.

Sneddon argues that the autonomy of persons is more important than the autonomy of choice, and that, therefore, some forms of paternalism can be justified. What can be justified is restricting a person's autonomy of choice in order to protect her autonomy as a person. As he argues for these things, something funny happens to his idea of autonomy of choice. His "hierarchical" theory of autonomous choice is forgotten and quietly replaced by the commonsense idea of freedom to act as one wishes. Take, for example, forcing me to wear a seatbelt. Sneddon takes for granted that such an act restricts my autonomy of choice. But how, if an autonomous choice is but an endorsed choice? The lawmakers who make me wear the seatbelt do not cause me to become addicted, compulsive or even akratic. Even if I object to seatbelts, when I choose to wear one to avoid punishment that choice can be perfectly wholehearted. In other words, Sneddon's theory of autonomous choice is mostly irrelevant to his discussion of paternalism. By "restricting autonomy of choice" he usually means "restricting freedom to act".

Such freedom may be restricted even when there is no question of harm to others if the alternative is too detrimental to the autonomy of persons. Sneddon's justification of (some) paternalism is special in that it relies on that concept of autonomy rather than on considerations of the wellbeing of the person towards whom the paternalism is directed. You might wonder what seatbelt or helmet laws have to do with self-shaping informed by self-knowledge. Sneddon has an elegant answer: road accidents cause head injuries, and head injuries hinder self-knowledge and self-shaping. Other injuries severely limit your range of choices (does that kind of limitation threaten your autonomy as a person? The self-shaping vs. life-shaping issue raises its ugly head). Sneddon's view would justify laws against hard drugs, I assume. What of fluoride in the water supply? He mentions it in passing as a restriction on choice, and I do not think he can justify it, as tooth decay does not particularly decrease the autonomy of persons. Other questions arise in the case of choosing to die (he supports assisted suicide, and I am not sure he can). There is more to Sneddon's view of paternalism, but I would like to take a step back and look at its foundation.

Recall that the reason it is permissible to restrict autonomy of choice for the sake of autonomy of persons is that the latter is more important. Why is it more important? Sneddon's main argument is this:

Our choices can be made, in principle, about anything. . . . Some of our choices will . . . concern trivial matters. . . . However, autonomy of personhood concerns something that is not trivial: our very selves. Things that are, in and of themselves, trivial gain a non-trivial status when they are incorporated into the processes of self-shaping. The argument is not that valuing things makes them valuable. It is the following more complex inference:

1.     Premise one: Human selves have value.

2.     Premise two: Such selves stand in complex relations, including constitutive ones, to, in principle, anything.

3.     Conclusion: Anything, when standing in the appropriate relations to human selves, acquires value derivative from that of these selves. (p. 123)

Let's start from end -- the skeletal version of the "inference" -- and consider the conclusion. It is not phrased clearly. Which relations are "appropriate"? Perhaps the conclusion should be phrased as "there are relations to human selves such that anything that stands in these relations has value". If so, the argument is invalid. From the mere existence or possibility of complex relations between valuable human selves and other things it does not follow that some such relations confer value (if we replace the words 'the appropriate' with the word 'constitutive', it does not help very much). Furthermore, accepting the conclusion is a far cry from agreeing that it is permissible to restrict our freedom to act for the sake of our capacity for self-shaping. Sneddon fails to lead us from one to the other.

Now turn to the preceding paragraph. Autonomy of persons is more important than autonomy of choice, says Sneddon, because some of our choices concern trivial matters, while anything that is "incorporated into the self-shaping process" is non-trivial. I am not sure about the last claim. According to Sneddon, whether or not you have French fries is usually a trivial matter. If so, why can it not be a trivial matter whether you keep or reject the occasional desire to have fries? Even assuming self-shaping choices are never trivial, adding the premise "some choices are trivial" fails to yield the conclusion "the ability to shape yourself is more important than the freedom to make (any other) choices".

This book is quite interesting, but not enough to compensate for such dearth of philosophical workmanship. Autonomy is a very treacherous topic, but even so, one can do better.