Averroes on Intellect: From Aristotelian Origins to Aquinas’ Critique

Averroes On Intellect From Aristotelian Origins To Aquinas Critique

Stephen R. Ogden, Averroes on Intellect: From Aristotelian Origins to Aquinas’ Critique, Oxford University Press, 2022, 281pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192896117.

Reviewed by Kendall A. Fisher, Gonzaga University


Stephen R. Ogden’s Averroes on Intellect provides an insightful and rich examination of Classical Islamic Philosopher, Ibn Rushd’s (1126–1198 CE) account of intellect. Ibn Rushd, Latinized to “Averroes”, (in)famously held that all human beings share a single, separate (i.e., immaterial), and eternal intellect. This view sparked major controversy in the Latin world, famously drawing the ire of Thomas Aquinas. But as Ogden rightly notes, Averroes’ view represents a unique and provocative interpretation of Aristotle, bolstered by Averroes’ own innovative philosophical arguments. It is, therefore, well worth examining in its own right. Moreover, as Ogden observes, Averroes’ view forces us to reckon with the puzzling status of intellect in the Aristotelian framework and the wide diversity amongst Aristotelian hylomorphic views. The book consists of five main chapters and involves the detailed examination of Averroes’ interpretation of Aristotle, careful analysis of Averroes’ two central arguments for his unicity thesis, an evaluation of Aquinas’ critique, and an evaluation of an Averroist critique of views on which matter is the principle of individuation, yet immaterial intellects are multiplied in accordance with human knowers. To reach the depth and detail that Ogden achieves, he assumes a reader with some familiarity with the Aristotelian framework and the Islamic and Latin Medieval traditions.

In chapter one, Ogden motivates Averroes’ “all-or-nothing” reading of Aristotle’s De Anima III.4–5, which he argues Aquinas also adopts. Both thinkers maintain that the intellect that “becomes all things,” introduced in DA III.4 and the intellect that “makes all things,” introduced in DA III.5, have the same ontological status, since Aristotle characterizes each as unmixed, impassible, and separate. For Averroes, these two intellects, “material” and “agent” respectively, are separate, immaterial, and eternal substances, while for Aquinas they are powers of individuated human souls. Nevertheless, each thinker believes that what is true ontologically of one is true of the other—hence “all-or-nothing.” By contrast, most ancient and contemporary commentators subscribe to “split-level” views, taking agent intellect to be single, immaterial, and eternal but positing a multiplicity of (often) generable and/or corruptible material intellects. Thus, Averroes and Aquinas hold a minority position in the interpretive landscape.

The similarity between their views is no mere coincidence. Ogden argues convincingly that Averroes was Aquinas’ primary source for his De Anima commentary. Anyone familiar with Aquinas’ commentary knows that he has Averroes firmly in mind. But Aquinas’ explicit references serve mainly to highlight their disagreements. Ogden, by contrast, draws our attention to the similarities, pointing out where Aquinas’ interpretations, justifications, and explanations mirror those of Averroes. The similarities and the fact that Averroes’ commentary would have provided the only known exposure to some of the views Aquinas discusses, such as Alexander of Aphrodisias’, strongly supports Ogden’s claim. His discussion, therefore, provides an important corrective to the wholly polemical framing often found in discussions of Aquinas’ and Averroes’ views.

Next, Ogden defends the all-or-nothing reading as a viable interpretation of Aristotle—and indeed, one to be reckoned with. He argues that, despite their lack of access to the original Greek, Averroes’ and Aquinas’ use of the terms “unmixed,” “impassible,” and “separate” plausibly reflect the text of the De Anima. Thus, the all-or-nothing reading is a defensible interpretation worthy of consideration. While the reading is viable, Ogden’s discussion is unlikely to unsettle adherents of the split-level view. Split-level interpreters can and do maintain that both intellects are unmixed, impassible, and separate, but in different ways or to different extents. Given Aristotle’s recognition of differing senses and degrees of impassibility (which Ogden notes) and Averroes and Aquinas’ own disagreement about the meaning of “separate” (which Ogden also notes), split-level adherents have options and may not consider the interpretive costs of their strategy to be particularly costly. Although Ogden offers a persuasive rejection of some split-level attempts, the general strategy will likely remain dominant. To be fair, however, Ogden aims to show that the all-or-nothing reading is defensible, not necessarily that it is best.

Chapters two and three contain some of Ogden’s most significant and original contributions. In each, he reconstructs and evaluates one of the two arguments that Averroes offers for his novel position: the Determinate Particular Argument (DPA) and the Unity Argument (UA). In the DPA, which appears in the Long Commentary on the De Anima (LCDA) III.5, Averroes argues that if the material intellect were a determinate particular, or a body, or a power in a body, it would receive forms as particularized and thus only potentially intelligible. To understand, however, it must receive them as actually intelligible (i.e., universal). Consequently, the material intellect must be separate from matter and, therefore, eternal. Although Averroes is not explicit on the point, Ogden rightly argues that his conclusion must be qualified: the material intellect cannot be a material determinate particular (despite its name!) but it does remain particular for Averroes—not universal.

Next, Ogden offers a controversial but compelling thesis: Even if the premises of the DPA were true, they could only secure its separateness and perhaps its eternality—not its singularity. By contrast, most scholars take the DPA as intended to establish all three: According to Averroes, matter is the principle of individuation for members of a species, so presumably by showing the material intellect is separate (i.e., immaterial), we have also shown that it cannot be multiplied. Ogden considers this line of argument, but argues that it assumes that separate intellects are each unique in a species. Although this view was common amongst Medievals, for Averroes, separate intellects share in a species and differ analogically. This, then, precludes any inference from the immateriality of the material intellect to its unicity.

Lastly, Ogden considers whether or not Averroes himself took the DPA to establish the unicity of the material intellect. Ogden presents the case for both sides, but ultimately remains undecided. Here, however, the textual evidence for believing that Averroes did take the DPA to have established unicity seems far stronger than Ogden’s presentation suggests. After the DPA but before the UA (which Ogden argues is the decisive argument in favor of the oneness of the material intellect), Averroes raises a “formidable” question for Aristotle’s (i.e., Averroes’ own) view: Since the material intellect is the first actuality of a human, if it is one for all humans, then presumably, their final actuality (intellective activity) is one as well (LCDA III.5 [399]). The trouble is, it’s not. You can understand something without my understanding it. When Averroes expounds this problem, he explicitly rejects the multiplicity of material intellects by appealing to the DPA (LCDA III.5 [401–2]). This strongly suggests that Averroes takes the DPA to rule out the multiplication of material intellect thereby entailing its unicity. Indeed, he uses it to do just that. Furthermore, prior to the UA he states that, on his view, the intellect is one for all humans (LCDA III.5 [406]).

Ogden presents this evidence, but maintains that the structure of LCDA III.5 suggests otherwise. After all, Averroes states, “those questions are dissolved” only after offering the UA. Ogden takes this to mean that, for Averroes, the question of unicity is still open and unresolved until after the UA, and thus Averroes must not consider unicity to follow from the DPA. But arguably, “those questions” refers not to the straightforward question of whether the material intellect is one or many, but rather to the questions that arise precisely from its oneness: e.g., why when one human understands an intelligible, all humans do not thereby understand that intelligible. Averroes must address such questions before the matter can be put to rest, but that doesn’t necessarily give us reason to suppose that unicity is not, in his view, entailed by the DPA.

In chapter three, Ogden turns to the UA. This argument at the end of LCDA III.5 reduces the multiplicity view of material intellects to absurdity. On Ogden’s presentation, Averroes argues that if the material intellect were many, then when two people understand (putatively) the same intelligible, there would be nothing in virtue of which the intelligible in one of them and the intelligible in the other are, in fact, the same—unless we posit some further intelligible to unite them. But for Averroes, who is no friend to free-floating intelligibles, this further intelligible must exist in an intellect. And if so, the problem arises again, for in virtue of what are the (now) three intelligibles unified? We must posit a further intelligible, and with it, another intellect. An infinite regress ensues.

The UA has often been cast as something of an afterthought—one more mark in favor of Averroes’ settled position. It certainly slips past quickly in the text. But for Ogden, it is no afterthought. Instead, it is Averroes’ primary argument for the oneness of the intellect, insofar as it rules out multiplicity views. Whether or not Averroes saw it as such, Ogden is certainly right that the challenge the UA poses for multiplicity views is often underappreciated. Since individuated intellects receive individuated intelligible forms, where do we ground the unity of our concepts? Ogden considers potential ancient and medieval responses to the UA. He ultimately argues that an appeal to common essences, like we find in Avicenna and Aquinas (and indeed, in some form in Averroes’ thought, too, according to Ogden), could provide a satisfactory answer. Still, he notes that such a view would likely not satisfy Averroes. Among other things, it simply could not provide the unity that Averroes’ account can. For Averroes, the intelligibles really are one for all.

In chapter four, Ogden takes up Aquinas’ numerous criticisms of Averroes, looking first at those that concern the individuation of one human’s intellective acts from another’s. Ogden argues convincingly that Averroes can deflect these by appealing to what is known as his dual-subject theory of cognitive acts. On this view, every intellective act has two subjects: the subject of truth and the subject of existence. The subject of truth is the source of the intelligible content for the given act. The subject of existence is that in which the intelligible exists. Averroes provides a helpful comparison with sensation: In sensation, the sensible object is the subject of truth. It is the source of the sensible content, that is, the sensible intention. The soul together with the sense organ is the subject of existence. It is that in which the sensible intention comes to exist. In intellection, intentions in the human imagination provide the content for an intelligible—humans are the subjects of truth—while the material intellect serves as the subject of existence for the intelligible itself. Humans are thus united to the intelligibles by means of the intentions in their imaginations and different acts of human understanding can be individuated by means of their distinct imagined intentions.

Next Ogden turns to Aquinas’ most emphatic critique, namely, that “this man understands,”( “hic homo intelligit”). Aquinas charges Averroes with failing to account for how individual humans understand. He insists that on Averroes’ view, we seem to be understood rather than to understand in any legitimate sense. As Ogden crucially observes, Aquinas’ concern is not simply psychological. Of course, we must be able to account for our experience of ourselves as knowers, but the concern is also—if not more so—metaphysical. We must account, metaphysically, for how these acts of understanding are attributable to us, that is, how they are rightfully ours. For Aquinas, they can only be rightfully ours if we perform them by means of a power (i.e., a form) inhering in us.

As Ogden notes, a significant defense has been mounted on Averroes’ behalf with respect to the psychological version of this concern (notably, by Deborah Black and Jean-Baptiste Brenet). But he also rightly observes that these responses do not necessarily address the metaphysical version. Accordingly, Ogden turns to Richard Taylor’s metaphysically oriented defense. Taylor argues that, for Averroes, the material and agent intellects are forms for us and operative within our souls. Accordingly, Averroes satisfies Aquinas’ metaphysical requirement. Ogden, however, rejects this defense. While the intellects may be perfecting forms united to the imagined intentions in the individual, they cannot be substantial or accidental forms inhering in the human being as in a subject—except equivocally. Furthermore, he argues that Averroes likely shares Aquinas’ views regarding the proper attribution of operations.

Ogden’s arguments here are compelling, and they lead him to a significant and controversial conclusion: According to Averroes, individual human beings do not understand—at least not properly speaking. Instead, Ogden takes Averroes to offer an error theory on which we attribute acts of understanding to individual humans because they are initiated through human volition. These acts are not carried out by humans, however, and thus, properly speaking, humans do not understand. In support of his interpretation, Ogden points to passages where Averroes characterizes understanding as “receiving the intelligibles.” While the material intellect does this as the subject of existence for the intelligibles, human beings, as subjects of truth, do not.

Ogden does not, by any means, fully concede to Aquinas on Averroes’ behalf. Humans are not disconnected from acts of understanding. They are not simple bystanders or objects known. They can be consciously aware of intellective acts insofar as they are conscious subjects united to the intelligibles through the intentions in their imaginations—intentions which are partly constitutive of the acts themselves. Moreover, the acts occur when individual human knowers will them. On these grounds, humans may be considered rational. And yet, strictly speaking, this human doesn’t understand. This would be a surprising result, but the evidence Ogden offers in its favor, both textual and philosophical, is substantial. 

In chapter five, Ogden raises an Averroist objection against views which posit matter as the principle of individuation and yet multiply immaterial material intellects—views such as Avicenna’s and Aquinas.’ For these two thinkers, these intellects are individuated due to their connection with an individual human body. Although Averroes may reject these views as inconsistent, they are, according to Ogden, philosophically defensible. That said, they require fancy philosophical footwork and come at a cost. Averroes’ account is more parsimonious and theoretically streamlined, with fewer exceptional cases.

On the whole, Ogden’s discussion provides an important and refreshing reorientation by evaluating Averroes’ view squarely within his own framework—not Aquinas’—and focusing on Averroes’ often unrecognized positive influence on Aquinas’ thought. As Ogden’s book shows, dismissing Averroes’ view, strange as it may seem, is considerably more difficult when considered within his own framework and with his own philosophical priorities in view. If Ogden is right, Averroes’ position requires an error theory, but it boasts other weighty philosophical strengths: parsimony, consistency, unified universals. Ogden’s book provides a perceptive, articulate, and philosophically sophisticated treatment and will be of interest to anyone seeking a more complete understanding of Averroes’ or Aquinas’ position on intellect.