Avicenna on the Necessity of the Actual: His Interpretation of Four Aristotelian Arguments

Avicenna Necessity

Celia Kathryn Hatherly, Avicenna on the Necessity of the Actual: His Interpretation of Four Aristotelian Arguments, Lexington Books, 2022, 192pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781666904482.

Reviewed by Thérèse-Anne Druart, The Catholic University of America


This book centers on metaphysics by means of a detailed analysis of the way Avicenna adopts and adapts four Aristotelian arguments. Celia Hatherly focuses on the modal distinction, which is universal and exclusive, and claims that whatever exists, while it exists, exists of necessity, be it a necessity per se or per aliud. It is universal as it applies to anything that actually exists and it is exclusive since no actually existing being can exist both per se and per aliud. Hatherly shows that this distinction is more important than has previously been thought, as Avicenna uses it to develop his own interpretation of four Aristotelian arguments in order to defend God’s eternal creation of the cosmos. These four Aristotelian arguments are: 1. the argument for the finitude of efficient causes in Metaphysics II; 2. the proof for the prime mover in Physics VIII and Metaphysics XII; 3. the argument against the Megarians’ denial of potency in Metaphysics IX; and 4. the argument for the mutual entailment between the necessary and the eternal in De caelo I.12.

Wanting to emphasize the coherence of Avicennian metaphysics, Hatherly wisely does not simply present a list the four arguments together with an account of the way Avicenna adapts them to his own needs. Rather, she integrates her analysis into a broader metaphysical approach and so divides the book into three parts. For each part she highlights how the modal character of every being illuminates the relationship between God, the only Necessary Existent per se, and the cosmos existing per aliud.

Part I deals with Avicenna’s two arguments for the cosmos’ need for an efficient cause of its existence. The first, found in the Salvation, Genesis and Return and Remarks and Admonitions relies explicitly on the modal distinction as the totality of all possible beings that exist at a given moment must be possible per se and, therefore, being necessary per aliud, requires a cause existing per se. The second, used in The Metaphysics of the Healing, adapts Aristotle’s argument in Metaphysics II and relies on the denial of an infinite regress of efficient causes. Both of these arguments give rise to controversies, which Hatherly tackles expertly. On her account, the modal distinction entails that every possible being and every true efficient cause belongs to an essentially ordered series, and this is an important contribution to our understanding of Avicenna’s metaphysics.

Part II shows how the modal distinction supports Avicenna’s contention that the proof for the existence of the Necessary Existent as efficient cause must be given in metaphysics rather than in physics. Avicenna concedes that physics proves that there is an unmoved final cause of motion but denies that the proof from motion can show that this unmoved mover is none other than God, i.e., the efficient cause of existence. The physics argument does not allow us to determine whether the unmoved mover is one of the separate intellects or the Necessary Existent itself. Yet, Avicenna does not at all deny that God is the ultimate final cause of motion. In fact, he argues that God is the ultimate final cause in The Metaphysics of the Healing, IX, while giving an account of one of God’s attributes, that is, His goodness, in a text that up to now had not been much studied. If one has not already mastered Avicenna’s distinction between physical causes, which are only preparatory to origination and yield only motion or change, and metaphysical causes, which alone are true efficient causes granting and preserving existence, one may find this part difficult to follow.

Part III, building on the proofs that God is both the ultimate efficient and the ultimate final cause, shows that the Necessary Existent must exercise this causality eternally. In order to do so Hatherly selects, from the arguments for the eternity of the world, those based on the nature of motion and generation or coming to be as they rely on the modal distinction. She first focuses on the role that prior material potency plays in Avicenna’s argument for the eternity of the world. She then considers an objection based on De caelo, I, 12, that Avicenna raised against his own proof for the eternity of the world and how he deflects it by using the modal distinction in his reworking of that argument. This Avicennian argument has not previously been carefully analyzed. Hatherly also considers another objection Avicenna raises against himself on the basis of Philoponus and how once again he sidesteps it. Here again Avicenna’s argument has not hitherto received a proper examination.

I found part III, which explores new territory, particularly rewarding. Yet, I would have liked Hatherly to spell out more how Avicenna, who argues for prior material potency for generated, perishable beings, defends the immortality of the human soul, which, though generated and, therefore requiring a prior material potency, is not perishable. We all know that many aspects of Avicenna’s doctrine of the human soul and, in particular, issues concerning its origination as well as the immortality and activity of the human intellect after death, are fraught with difficulties. Here I would like to raise some difficulties about the account of the origination of the human soul.

In chapter five of this third part, Hatherly explains how in The Metaphysics of the Healing, IV, 2 Avicenna distinguishes remote or incomplete passive material power from proximate or complete active material potency. For human action, he takes the example of a wooden key. The tree is only a very remote and incomplete passive power for the origination of the key. It needs first to be felled and the wood cured before that wood can be made into a key. Furthermore, the wood must be brought to the key-maker so he can work on it. This requires physical proximity. Hatherly summarizes Avicenna’s contention in the following way: “a material substratum must precede all origination because, if something does not exist, its existence is possible only if its origination is possible. Origination is only possible if motion changes the spatial relations between bodies, thereby rendering X’s potential true efficient cause sufficient for X’s existence after being insufficient for some time” (138). This account works well for the key-making case, but seems to me rather problematic for some natural events. For instance, clouds can hide the light of the sun. When they move away, the light of the sun becomes visible, but this does not mean that the spatial relation between the sun and the illuminated earthly spot has changed, strictly speaking. The simpler explanation is simply that an obstacle has been removed. If we now consider the case of the origination of the soul, I find the summary Hatherly gives, and which requires a change in spatial relations, still more puzzling. Avicenna himself in IV, 2, gives the example of the origination of a human being from sperm to highlight the inability of an active power to act on a remote passive power. This example, I think, raises two difficulties. First, the sperm indeed moves to join the menses in Avicenna’s biology, but does this joining the menses change the spatial relation with the true proximate efficient cause, the Agent Intellect, which is immaterial? Second, Avicenna himself says that strictly speaking sperm “does not have a passive power. For it is impossible for the sperm, while still a sperm, to be acted on so as to become a man” (Marmura’s translation, 12, Hatherly, 134). I am wondering how this differs from the case of the tree having a passive power to become a key. To become a key, the tree will have to stop being a tree, i.e., being alive. When its wood is worked on to become a key, it no longer is a tree.

In her book Hatherly makes a good case for her contention that the modal distinction is key to understanding Avicenna’s metaphysics. Robert Wisnovsky has already previously made that claim, but Hatherly justifies it in far greater detail, showing how this modal distinction grounds many more arguments for more metaphysical issues than previously appreciated. Her illuminating and intricate analysis of these various arguments shows how they are interrelated as well as how they help Avicenna twist Aristotelian arguments to his own purposes. The adaptations and twists he brings to them allows him even to use them to defend views Aristotle seems not to have endorsed, such as God as the ultimate efficient cause and continuous creation. She also highlights arguments that have not been much examined. Most of her work rests on The Metaphysics of the Healing, which is Avicenna’s most developed and well-known metaphysical summa, but when necessary, she appeals to less known texts, such as the Salvation, Genesis and Return, Remarks and Admonitions, The Physics of the Healing, Treatise on Love, and Commentary on Metaphysics Lambda. These recourses help to flesh out particularly compact arguments or to develop sub arguments that were simply adumbrated in The Metaphysics of the Healing. They also show that Hatherly has serious knowledge of the whole Avicennian philosophical corpus and its chronology.                 

The book is very well organized, and each part begins with preliminary remarks, which give the necessary context. Hatherly successfully unpacks Avicenna’s arguments, which often are very compact and at times elliptical. Her spelling out all the steps and clarifying how at times her interpretation differs from that of previous scholars are very illuminating. Yet, she does not get lost in detail; she always focuses on what the argument is designed to achieve and is not uncritical of them. She also makes good use of the Greek commentators, who already at times departed from Aristotle and began to adapt his arguments for their own purposes. Furthermore, she shows a mastery of the secondary literature and clearly highlights her own take on several debated issues with both clarity and courtesy. It is a pity that the copyediting or/and the proofreading was so poorly done that at times it distracts the reader. Some short words, such as prepositions, are duplicated or missing, and typographical errors are not uncommon. Twice end notes are duplicated (p. 27, notes 33 and 34 and p. 68, notes 14 and 15).

This is a very scholarly book, which is well worth a close reading, but, despite its clarity, it is not an easy read and assumes the reader already has a good grounding in The Metaphysics of the Healing.