Axiomatic Theories of Truth

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Volker Halbach, Axiomatic Theories of Truth, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 364pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521115810.

Reviewed by Solomon Feferman, Stanford University


This year (2011) has been a banner one for truth or, to be more precise, for conferences and workshops on philosophical and logical theories of truth. To my knowledge there have been or will shortly be at least four such, namely at Amsterdam, Princeton, Paris and Oxford, all planned independently. If we take this as an indication of a substantial upsurge of interest and activity in recent years on theories of truth, the book under review is very much of the moment and is on its way to becoming indispensable to those interested in the subject -- philosophers as well as logicians, aspiring as well as established.  For it is the best book of its kind to appear in some years.

The author's division of the general subject stated at the outset is between definitional and axiomatic theories of truth, of which the latter is its primary subject matter. Among the former the author counts such traditional theories as those of correspondence, utility, coherence, consensus, and so on, which are concerned to define the nature of truth. I think it is more informative to make instead a contrast between philosophical and logical theories of truth, so that the mentioned traditional "substantive" theories fall under the philosophical side together with such theories as those of deflationism and (Davidsonian) primitivism, which do not propose a definition (or rather, general explanation) but are concerned rather with what purposes are served by the notion of truth. On the logical side, by contrast, we have both semantic theories in which a truth-like notion is defined in precise mathematical (model-theoretic) terms, and axiomatic theories in which such a notion is taken as a primitive and various of its properties are laid out precisely in more or less formal terms. Halbach subsumes semantic theories under the definitional ones, but they are of a different character from the philosophical theories. With one major exception, the present book is primarily concerned with a comparative exposition of the leading axiomatic theories of truth based on classical logic. But inter alia it is much concerned with related semantic theories and with the significance of the axiomatic theories considered for philosophical theories and especially for deflationism and its kin.

Aside from collections of various sorts, most notably that of Robert L. Martin, Recent Essays on Truth and the Liar Paradox (1984), there have been a number of books over the years devoted to specific semantic and axiomatic approaches such as those by Jon Barwise and John Etchemendy, Jon Barwise and John Perry, Nuel Belnap and Anil Gupta, Hartry Field, Tim Maudlin, and Vann McGee. But the only books previous to the one at hand to present a systematic comparison of axiomatic theories in general are those of Andrea Cantini, Logical Frameworks for Truth and Abstraction: An axiomatic approach, and the author's own Axiomatische Wahrheitstheorien, both dating to 1996. Halbach's new book supersedes both of these in many respects and takes full account of the considerable intervening research literature within its chosen framework, which is to concentrate almost entirely on axiomatic theories of truth based on classical logic and extending Peano Arithmetic; reasons for these choices, to which we shall return below, are given full discussion in the book.

The division of the text into four parts is very neat. Part I ("Foundations") deals with motivations for the axiomatic approach, then with some historical background -- especially the work of Tarski -- and presents the required technical background. The subject of Part II is typed theories of truth, while that of Part III -- the most extensive -- is untyped theories of truth. Finally, Part IV ("Ways to the truth") explores some of the philosophical significance of the formal results exposited in Parts II and III. To some extent, the reader can pick and choose his way through all this material, while those whose primary interest will be in Part IV can take the formal results on faith, after having become acquainted with the technical preliminaries in Chs. 5 and 6 of Part I. I shall largely follow this division into the four parts in the rest of my review but, given the richness of the contents of this book, can only hit the high points.

Definitional theories are supposed to explain truth in terms of more basic notions, and if successful would permit its eliminability. One of the motivations considered in Part I for axiomatizing truth instead of seeking a definition of it is that one often feels less certain about the nature of the concepts called on in such definitions than about the character of truth itself. For example, all sorts of difficulties are raised in the correspondence theory of truth as to the nature and properties of facts or states of affairs, of the relation of obtaining, and of correspondence itself. While axiomatic theories are compatible with definitional theories, they do not presume them, and they serve to clarify one's working assumptions about truth. Moreover, they can be used to subsume non-definitional theories of truth such as deflationism and primitivism. (In any case the issue of eliminability of truth appears in the axiomatic framework in terms of the question of conservativity of a formal system for truth over a base theory.) Another reason for concentrating on the axiomatics of semantic theories such as those of Tarski and Kripke is that one thereby is able to separate the principles of truth from the (usually far stronger) set-theoretic machinery needed to construct the given models. Finally, axiomatic theories of truth can be compared with each other in a way that philosophical and semantic theories cannot, by means of the methods of interpretation and proof-theoretic reduction so that one can speak of one theory being stronger (or weaker) than another.

Granted that truth is a property of certain kinds of objects, a basic foundational issue in Part I is the nature of those objects: are they sentences or are they propositions? We have excellent theories of sentences as structured syntactic objects; these can be dealt with in full precision and with great flexibility in formal theories of syntax as provided, for example, in concatenation theory, or elementary set theory, or in arithmetic via Gödel coding. The author's choice, as is standard in the preponderance of the literature on axiomatic theories is to take Peano Arithmetic (PA) as a base theory, though weaker theories suffice for much of the work. What the reader is expected to have in the way of background about working in PA is some acquaintance with the proofs of Gödel's incompleteness theorems and with the basic concepts of recursion theory and metamathematics; Chs. 5 and 6 at the end of Part I give an excellent review and fix notation and technical details.

Coming back to sentences vs. propositions, the structure of sentences is essential to the presentation of compositional theories of truth. By contrast, the nature of propositions is obscure by comparison; one issue is whether or not they are structured objects. It is a common idea that sentences from the same or different languages can express the same proposition and hence have the same truth value. But what does it mean for a sentence to express a proposition? When do two sentences express the same proposition? Are all propositions expressible in some language? Finally, do all sentences in a given language express a proposition? When we settle, as the author does -- and as is customary in work on axiomatic theories of truth -- on sentences being the truth-bearers, one avoids dealing with all but the last of these difficult questions and concentrates instead in each axiomatic theory on a more precise question: Which sentences are the truth bearers? Syntactically, given a sentence A with a code #A (a device for quoting A) in the language of PA, when is it admissible to consider T(#A) in one's theory? (NB. My notation differs from Halbach's.)

Famously, this question goes back to Tarski's ground-breaking work in the mid 1930s. He took it as a necessary condition on providing a notion of truth that it can be shown to satisfy all sentences of the form T(#A) ↔ A, often called the T-sentences but primarily referred to in the book as the Tarski biconditionals. Tarski showed via an arithmetization of the Liar Paradox under quite minimal assumptions about one's logic and base theory that if A is allowed to contain the predicate T then a contradiction is derivable. His conclusion was that a formal definition of truth would have to be made relative to any given language L whose basic predicates do not contain the truth predicate for L and are accepted to have a prior meaning in an associated metalanguage M. Then the definition of truth for sentences of such L is defined compositionally for all sentences of L, provided that M is sufficiently strong to carry out the requisite recursive definition.

From the axiomatic point of view, Tarski's work is the point of departure for the treatment of typed theories of truth in Part II. The base language L is that of PA, and what takes the place of the metalanguage M is the extension LT of L obtained by adjoining the unary predicate symbol T as a new basic symbol. The question then is what axioms about T are to be added? The first theories examined are TB and UTB, which are of a disquotational character. TB adds to PA all the Tarski-biconditionals for sentences A of L, and UTB expresses the corresponding biconditionals in a uniform way for formulas which may have free variables. In addition, in both theories one extends the induction scheme to apply to all formulas in LT, though restricted schemes are also considered. An easy argument shows that UTB, and hence TB, is conservative over PA. TB is the natural candidate to formulate Quine's disquotational theory of truth, whose use was supposed to lead to such generalizations as "All sentences of the form 'if p then p' are true"; but the conservativity arguments show that not to be the case.

Next, Halbach turns to compositional theories of truth, where the clauses of Tarski's definition of truth now appear as axioms in the form of closure conditions on T. The basic such theory is dubbed CT, again with induction extended to all formulas of LT, though a restricted version is again considered. One uses operations on numbers ¬., ∨., etc., which are such that ¬.(#A) = #(¬A), (#A) ∨.(#B) = #(A ∨ B), etc. Take Sent(x) to express that x is the code of a sentence of L. Then the axiom for negation takes the form

∀x[Sent(x) → (T(¬.x) ↔ ¬T(x))]

and that for disjunction takes the form

∀x∀y[Sent(x) ∧ Sent(y) → (T(x∨.y) ↔ T(x) ∨ T(y))],

and similarly for conjunction, universal and existential quantification. A basic axiom expresses for closed terms s and t that the truth of s = t is equivalent to s = t. It is proved that UTB and hence TB is a subtheory of CT, and the same holds when induction is restricted to formulas of L. More work (carried out in full by a cut-elimination argument) is needed to show that the restricted version of CT is a conservative extension of PA, but CT itself is not since it proves the consistency of PA. The strength of CT in full is shown to be the same as that of the second-order theory ACA of numbers and sets of numbers based on the arithmetical comprehension axiom. Part II concludes with a description of axiomatic Tarskian hierarchies in what are called ramified theories of truth RTα taken through certain ordinals α. RT0 is just CT, while RT1 stands to RT0 as CT stands to PA, and so on; RT is the union of the RTn's, and then one can continue the iteration further into the transfinite. In general RT for limit α is the union of all RTβ for β < α.

The major value of the book lies in Part III which is devoted to various theories that are type-free in the sense that one can consider x in T(x) to range over codes of sentences of LT or significant subsets of that. In ordinary parlance, T is allowed to be "self-applicable" or "self-referential". The feeling that typed systems and their hierarchical iterations are not natural is one of the reasons for considering type-free languages; certainly natural language makes no such restrictions. Another reason is that the kinds of generalizations claimed for a disquotational theory of truth by Quine and seen as the main purpose of a theory of truth by the deflationists are more directly facilitated in type-free theories. The problem is to skirt the paradoxes while achieving such ends. One way out was taken by Harvey Friedman and Michael Sheard in joint work from the late 1980s. That is to take in place of the Tarski-biconditionals T(#A) ↔ A two rules of inference applicable to all sentences of L­T, called necessitation (in analogy to modal logic) and co-necessitation, respectively:

NEC From A infer T(#A)

CONEC From T(#A) infer A.

Friedman and Sheard investigated systematically the consistency of a number of theories in which some combination of these rules with other axioms is made. Halbach presents a version of one of these that he denotes FS. For this, take SentT(x) to be a formula of L expressing that x is a Gödel number of a sentence of LT. The system FS has: (i) as axioms all those of PA with induction extended to all formulas of LT, (ii) the compositional axioms of CT in which Sent is replaced throughout by SentT, and (iii) NEC and CONEC as its rules of inference (besides the underlying logical rules of inference such as Modus Ponens). An easy model-theoretic argument is used to show that FS is consistent (a proof-theoretic argument is also given). But an unsatisfactory feature of FS is that it is ω-inconsistent, i.e. there are formulas A(x) such that A(n) is provable for each n, while ¬∀x A(x) is also provable. On the other hand, FS is arithmetically sound, i.e., every sentence of L provable in FS is true in the standard model of PA. The strength of FS is shown to be the same as that of RT.

The next main type-free system considered in Part III is that designated KF, which constitutes an axiomatization in classical logic of Kripke's famous three-valued model from his 1975 paper, "Outline of a theory of truth". I developed this axiomatization not long after Kripke's paper appeared and circulated my axiomatization in notes; William Reinhardt took this up for consideration in 1985 and dubbed the system "Kripke-Feferman", which has stuck (my own publication on that and certain extensions did not appear until 1991). Kripke made use of a transfinite inductive definition whose fixed points are two sets of sentences S1 (the "true sentences") and S2 (the "false sentences"), such that T(#A) is in S1 (S2) if and only if A is in S1 (S2), and T(#¬A) is in S1 (S2) if and only if A is in S2 (S1); compounds under the other logical operators are treated compositionally as expected of the notions of truth and falsity. If one starts with the empty sets of sentences on both sides, the least fixed points S1 and S2 are disjoint and there are sentences -- like that for the Liar -- that belong to neither, i.e., one has "gaps". But other starting sets of sentences can lead to overlaps or "gluts". The main proof-theoretic result for KF is my theorem that it is of the same strength as RT, where α is the first Cantor epsilon number ε0; this is given a full proof by Halbach. I used KF as a base to explain a notion of reflective closure of arithmetic by adding a suitable substitution rule and some further axioms. Of this I showed that the resulting system is of the same strength as RT, where α is the Feferman-Schütte ordinal, which is the least non-predicative ordinal according to a certain analysis of predicativity.

A frequent criticism of KF is that its external logic, i.e., classical logic, is not in accord with its internal logic, i.e., the logic of sentences A for which T(#A) is provable. For example, the sentence T(#(A ∨ ¬A)) is not provable in KF for A expressing the Liar even though A ∨ ¬A is itself provable there. That led Halbach and Leon Horsten in 2006 to develop a system PKF based on partial three-valued logic whose internal and external logic agree. In his book, Halbach presents a variant form of PKF and proves that it is much weaker than KF, since its proof-theoretical strength is the same as that of RT for α = ωω.

In the first section of Part IV, Halbach addresses the question as to why, with the exception of PKF, he concentrated in this book entirely on theories formulated in classical logic. Interestingly, he has come to agree with me that the cost of working in weaker logics such as those of PKF is too high, since "nothing like sustained ordinary reasoning" can be carried out in them. On the other hand, Field and others have made use of hybrid logics that weaken certain classical principles to avoid the paradoxes, but in compensation make use of new operators with non-classical principles to strengthen them. These have attendant complications, but they deserve further study, especially as to their proof-theoretical strength. The remainder of Part IV contains interesting judicious discussions on the significance of the technical work in this book for disquotational theories and deflationism, reflection principles and reflective closure, and for applications to natural language. These are not easily summarized but are highly recommended to the philosophically minded reader: as throughout the book, these discussions are very thoughtful, careful and thorough.

Under the guidance of a knowledgeable instructor, the book could well serve as a text for a two quarter or year long course and I would highly recommend it for such, especially when supplemented by additional readings to expand the perspective and fill in the historical background. The problem for an independent reader will be to keep track of the welter of theories: twenty-seven are listed in the Index of Systems, which even the seasoned practitioner may need to consult on a regular basis to keep in mind which is which.