Ayn Rand's Normative Ethics: the Virtuous Egoist

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Tara Smith, Ayn Rand's Normative Ethics: the Virtuous Egoist, Cambridge, 2006, 309pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521860504.

Reviewed by Helen Cullyer, University of Pittsburgh


Those who think of Ayn Rand as the icon of callow youths rather than a serious moral philosopher are unlikely to recognize the Rand whom Smith presents to us. Drawing on Rand's novels, lectures, essays, and letters, Smith shows that her ethical theory is a form of naturalistic eudaimonism, which shares some features with the Aristotelian virtue ethics of Hursthouse and Foot, but differs from them in its unapologetic ethical egoism. This egoism is, however, as Smith argues, non-predatory and can accommodate helping others, genuine friendship, and even in certain circumstances risking one's life for another. Ultimately Rand appears as a somewhat paradoxical figure. A veneer of Nietzschean immoralism conceals the fact that, according to Smith, serving one's own interest in Randian fashion entails treating others in ways that are not as out of line with standard moral thinking as we may first assume. After tracing the outlines of Smith's argument, I will a raise worry as to whether her insistence that the virtuous agent places non-instrumental value on a variety of social relationships actually undermines Rand's egoistic individualism, and discuss briefly the political implications of Rand's ethics that hover just beneath the surface of the book.

In her Introduction, Smith argues that contemporary virtue ethicists dance around the question of ethical egoism. The reason is that egoism is usually considered predatory, hedonistic, or subjectivist. Chapters 2 and 3 provide a rigorous discussion of the Aristotelian grounding of Rand's project. Humans, just like animals or plants, have certain objective ends (food, water, safety) that promote our lives, but humans' ultimate goal is not only to maintain our lives, but to live well, which means excellent functioning, both physical and psychological (32). Such functioning is manifest primarily, as we learn in Chapter 8, as the active exercise of the virtue of productiveness, when we transform our natural surroundings in ways that meet our material and spiritual needs. Since excellent functioning is the goal of human life, reasons for acting must be egoistic; a person can only achieve this goal through her own efforts (33). Egoistic rational principles "stem entirely from their practical service to self-interest, as that is judged by rational, long-range standards" (36), and genuine self-interest cannot truly conflict with the interest of others (39). To be rational is to recognize and accept "reason as one's only source of knowledge… It means one’s total commitment to a state of full consciousness awareness, to the maintenance of a full mental focus" (52). The human capacity for reason is grounded metaphysically in free will, but to reason well is to realize the inescapability of general facts about human nature and also the context-dependent facts of particular situations.

Chapters 4-9 concern the other six virtues (honesty, independence, justice, integrity, productiveness and pride), which are forms or aspects of rationality, the "master" virtue (49). Smith's discussion of the six is searching and often compelling. In fact, even those who do not think that egoism is a viable moral theory will recognize the importance of many of these virtues for the virtuous life. Pride turns out to be self-respect plus the desire for self-improvement. Integrity is strength not only in holding onto one's ideals, but also in making them practical reality. The egoistic defense of honesty is also intriguing: pretense is "metaphysically impotent" in that in misrepresenting reality we cannot change it (79). Moreover, dishonesty is detrimental to self-esteem and fosters a sense of worthlessness.

Most controversial is the egoistic defense of justice. Smith argues, following Rand, that it is in one's own interests to treat people in accordance with objective desert. This view entails a rejection of egalitarianism, and Smith sets the Randian conception of justice squarely in opposition to that of Rawls. But the Randian view is tempered by three qualifications: (1) desert is contextual, and one must distinguish between those things over which people do and do not have control; (2) justice coexists with rights, since "each individual has a right to his own life and to pursue his own happiness" (171); and (3) the virtuous egoist will refuse to sanction evil.

In Chapter 10 and the Appendix, Smith moves away from Rand's "official" seven virtues and discusses implications for charity, generosity and temperance, and for loving others. Although the virtuous egoist will often have no reason to act generously or charitably, Smith gives examples of many situations where the virtuous egoist will act in these ways for the sake of some benefit to herself. In an Appendix, Smith, employing arguments that bear some similarity to those of Aristotle in Nicomachean Ethics 9.8, argues that the virtuous agent can in fact love others for their own sake, although her own happiness remains her ultimate goal.

Before raising an objection to Smith and Rand, it is worth noting briefly how they differ from other philosophers in the eudaimonistic tradition, who tend to view the good of the individual as both social and political. Most Aristotelians think that character is formed in a social and political context, and that human flourishing cannot be understood without considering individuals as parts of a community; as a result of ethical habituation, but also of natural sociality, we have reason to promote others' good. Thus Foot argues that humans are just particularly complex social animals, and she does not take the agent-centeredness of her ethical theory to entail that all of the virtuous agent's reasons for acting are egoistic. [1] Aristotle himself asserts that the virtuous agent undertakes fine actions for the sake of the fine (to kalon). While this motivation is not altruistic, fine actions are just those that are contextually appropriate for a socially and politically embedded individual. For Rand on the other hand, the moral self, while existing in a community, is free of it, self-created, and materially and psychologically independent; humans are not by nature "social" but they are "contractual" (130). Smith endorses not only Rand's principle that it is never moral to put another's good above one's own but also asserts that "ethics is not essentially social" (284).

Smith works hard, however, to show that the virtuous egoist's relationships with other people will be rich and rewarding. The egoist may even risk her life for another. Consider this example. A man, Bill, risks his life for the woman he loves, because "for him to courageously attempt the rescue and not "chicken out" would be in his interest (assuming that he values the woman's well-being more valuable than his life without her)" (194). According to egoism one should not sacrifice oneself for another (38), but the egoistic defense of the action is that this woman is one of the things that makes Bill's life worth living. Bill is making no sacrifice, but rationally placing her well-being, which he sees as central to his own happiness, above his own safety. We should note that Smith makes clear in her Appendix that the virtuous egoist can love others for their own sake, and not instrumentally, precisely because "another person might become valuable by becoming a vital ingredient of a person's happiness" (302). But if one's own flourishing includes the welfare of others, then we might object that human flourishing is after all a social rather than individualistic enterprise. For Bill realizes that his happiness involves loving others and risking himself for them. Smith will reply that the above example is unusual, and should not be taken as evidence that morality is somehow social. This kind of love is the exception and not the norm. It is only moral to put oneself in harm's way for another when two self-created, independent, and rational individuals love each other as friends. Most people will not merit this treatment. For one must exercise one's own independent judgment to figure out who is truly valuable to oneself (130-32).

But in fact Smith recognizes so many social relationships which enhance the flourishing of the individual (258-61), and which are based on affection, respect, and shared activity, that the careful reader may wonder whether Rand's view that man is a "contractual" animal, rather than a "lone wolf" or a "social animal" (130) can any longer be sustained. Smith begins to address this worry by noting that although generosity is only rational when it represents a fair trade of one value for another, the return that the benefactor receives in compensation for his service is not necessarily material: "the return can take many forms -- intellectual, emotional, the pleasure of a person's company, the deepening of a relationship" (261). One might agree with Smith here that if I give away a football ticket to an acquaintance, I am certainly acting in a way that shows that the value I place on the relationship is greater than the value I place on the ticket. I gain from the act of generosity by deepening our friendship, and 'trade' the ticket for something better. But the act of generosity is not truly a trade with my acquaintance unless I give the ticket to her with an expectation of receiving a determinate quantifiable and commensurable benefit in direct return. If I trade a football ticket for the deepening of a friendship, has 'trade' here not become a mere metaphor? The pleasure of company and the deepening of relationships are surely benefits to be shared and enjoyed communally, not traded? If this is the case, then individual human flourishing may turn out to be activity of the individual who is fully immersed in shared activities and purposes, rather than the rational trading of benefits between contractual individuals. The virtuous agent may still be an egoist formally speaking, in that she realizes that what is really in her interest is to engage in shared activities and purposes. But the 'I' tends to become a 'we', and the other and self united in a relationship that promotes our happiness.

Smith's discussion of independence (129-30) suggests that one important aspect of the claim that humans are not social is that the ethical-intellectual formation of the individual is not dependent on society. But if social activity is somehow central to the life of a rational adult, as Rand and Smith admit, might we not object that such activity is also central to the life of an incipiently rational child and that it is precisely this social context of human development that shapes the self? Smith dismisses the idea that individuals' characters and actions are determined by the society in which they are raised as empirically indefensible (129), but there is a more subtle and convincing position that Smith should address; namely that we are necessarily influenced, although not determined, by the societies in which we are raised and that moral and practical reasoning capacities grow not spontaneously, but out of and in reaction to specific communities.

Perhaps, however, we can best understand Rand's and Smith's position by putting it into its proper political context. The real claim being made here is not that humans do not tend towards sociality, but rather that by nature we are not part of a mutually sustaining political community or society in which individuals depend on each other. We must respect others' rights, but we have no reason to help others whom we do not know and value personally, although we will trade goods with many for our own benefit. While altruism is placing others above the self as a "fundamental rule of life", egoism does not entail sacrificing others for the sake of oneself, because the true egoist recognizes an objective and impartial right of everyone to pursue their own interest (39).

The coexistence of rights (to life, liberty, and property) and egoism is crucial to Rand's ethics and politics. Smith does not try to argue here that recognizing and respecting the rights of others is directly or indirectly in one's self-interest (174-5). In fact, the grounding of individual rights that she delineates looks rather Kantian: "Every living human being is an end in himself, not the means to the ends of the welfare of others… " (171). The respecting of others' rights, therefore, looks like it is a constraint on and exception to the egoistic ethical norm; act in self-interest except when it would infringe the rights of others. Yet Rand's theory of rights and ethical egoism rest on the same teleological basis; since the goal of each individual is to maintain her life and to flourish, each individual requires freedom from the predatory actions of others.[2]

Rand's egoistic individualism supports her libertarian political outlook, and this is certainly not concealed in Smith's treatment, although it is not in the foreground. Rand's view of the virtuous egoist as self-created, contractual, and productive provides the ethical basis of her political ideal of unregulated laissez-faire capitalism in which government's only role is to protect basic liberty and property rights. We should note that Rand's libertarianism is consistent in some respects with social liberalism, having no truck with discrimination on the basis of sex, race, or sexual orientation, and supporting freedom of speech in all contexts. But if we ask why the virtuous egoist should not be a social democrat, voting for higher taxes in order to ensure not only freedom from predation, but basic opportunities (like healthcare, education, social insurance) which benefit not only others but also herself, the Randian will reply that such taxes would violate property and liberty rights, and true justice. The social democrat's reply may argue for expanded conceptions of rights and freedom. But it will also surely attack as far too stringent Rand's assumption that virtue requires that each of us is able to be materially independent, providing for the self "all the material values that his life requires" (202), and stress that the libertarian ignores the increased opportunity and power that individuals enjoy when they act in common. It is not to be taken as a criticism of Smith's book that she does not engage more fully with these issues, given the ethical rather than political focus of the book. In fact, her 1995 book (see n. 2) does engage with some of these issues, although not from an explicitly Randian perspective. I raise the issue of Rand's politics only to point out that her ethics and politics are intertwined.

It should be stressed in conclusion that whether one is a fan or a detractor of Ayn Rand, the issues raised by this book are manifold and provocative. This book should force a debate of renewed vigor about what we mean by egoism, whether and how the egoism / altruism dichotomy should be applied within eudaimonistic ethical theories, and what our ethical theories imply about our political outlook. Smith provides us with a version of egoism that will need to be argued against by those who find it distasteful or misguided, rather than simply dismissed.

[1] Philippa Foot, Natural Goodness, Oxford, 2001, 16

[2] Smith's discussion of rights at 170-75 draws heavily on her earlier book Moral Rights and Political Freedom, Lanham MD, 1995.