Aztec Philosophy: Understanding a World in Motion

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James Maffie, Aztec Philosophy: Understanding a World in Motion, University Press of Colorado, 2014, 512pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781607322221.

Reviewed by Robert Eli Sanchez, Jr., University of California Institute for Mexico and the United States, University of California, Riverside


In this comprehensive study, James Maffie offers much more than an introduction to Aztec philosophy. For the reader unfamiliar with the Náhuatl-speaking people of the Central Valley of Mexico, whose capital Tenochtitlan was conquered by Hernán Cortés in 1521, Aztec Philosophy offers a close examination of Nahua life, thought, and culture; for the anthropologist and Mesoamericanist, it offers a philosophical lens through which to examine and evaluate standard interpretations of Aztec life and society; for the student of philosophy, it reconstructs a systematic and coherent worldview and provides enough material to pursue graduate level research; and for any reader, it is a model of how to bring multiple disciplines to bear on a topic that is beyond the scope of any one discipline.

Its title, however, is perhaps a little misleading given that the focus of Maffie's investigation is Aztec metaphysics, not philosophy broadly construed. Although Maffie occasionally gestures at an Aztec understanding of ethics, epistemology, aesthetics, and social and political philosophy, and tangentially discusses an Aztec theory of truth, the focus of this substantial tome is the Aztec view of "the nature, structure, and constitution of reality," of "what exists and the kind of existence that existing things enjoy" (21). The title is nonetheless justified since, as Maffie explains, the Aztecs did not distinguish the descriptive from the normative. They believed that they are both in and of this world, and so there is no clear line between metaphysics and understanding how to live well.

The book develops at least three interrelated theses. The first, introduced in the first chapter, is that the Aztecs were monists. According to Maffie, they believed both that reality consists of one thing and that it consists of one kind of thing: teotl in Náhuatl (pronounced TAY-oht). He dubs these two beliefs ontological and constitutional monism, respectively, and they provide the basis for his overarching interpretation of Aztec thought. Teotl is both identical with reality and is the basic stuff of reality (23). It is neither material nor immaterial but ambiguously both material and immaterial. It is "a tertium quid, a third kind of stuff that is neither mind nor matter (as customarily conceived by dualists)" (48). But what is it? It is "essentially power: continually active, actualized, and actualizing energy-in-motion" (23).

The second thesis, also introduced in the first chapter, is that the Aztecs subscribed to a process metaphysics, as opposed to "substance metaphysics," the dominant view in Western philosophy according to Maffie. On this view, processes, not objects or substances, are ontologically basic. Something is what it does, and everything is constantly in motion or flux. So it is not quite right to ask what teotl is, since it is a process that is constantly changing, moving, transforming, unfolding, and becoming. Instead, it is better to ask how teotl is. What are its modi operandi?

As Maffie demonstrates at various points, there are several upshots to attributing process metaphysics to the Aztecs, but I'll only briefly mention two here. The first is that it helps him to expand and defend the first thesis against well-established interpretations of Aztec cosmology. For instance, in his groundbreaking Aztec Thought and Culture -- the only other book-length examination of Aztec philosophy in English and the primary resource for students of philosophy until now -- Miguel León-Portilla argues that, like Plato, the Aztecs worried that reality is not what it appears to be, leading them to endorse a strand of dualism. However, as Maffie reminds his reader more than once, skepticism (an epistemological position) does not entail dualism (a metaphysical thesis), and what really bothered the Aztecs was that reality is not how it appears to be (55), a kind of skepticism that does not suggest dualism.

One other upshot of Maffie's process reading is his provocative account of Aztec religion, the subject of chapter two. As is well known, the Aztecs worshipped a colorful pantheon capable of rivaling those of the Greeks and Romans, and thus they are typically believed to be polytheists. However, polytheism implies substance metaphysics and conflicts with ontological monism. So, neck deep in empirical evidence, Maffie demonstrates that the Aztec gods and goddesses were not thought of as a multiplicity of independently existing deities or entities with unique sets of properties and powers. Instead, they were thought of "aspects" or "guises" of teotl, which itself was thought of as a "complex, all-encompassing unified macroprocess that consists of a myriad of coordinated microprocesses" (87). So, the gods and goddesses were considered more like natural microprocesses, and their names "serve[d] as conventional, shorthand handles or tags for specific constellations of processes" (88). These names, moreover, were complex, ambiguous, and useful for practical purposes. They often blurred into one another and did not refer to discrete perduring entities.

The main argument of chapter two is that the Aztecs were pantheists -- not monotheists, polytheists, or panentheists. To summarize an already brief summary of his complex argument, Maffie claims the Aztecs believed that the cosmos is unified, all-inclusive, and interconnected; that teotl is immanent in the cosmos; that it is identical with the cosmos; that the unity of the cosmos is explained by its identity with teotl; that the history of the cosmos is the self-unfolding of the cosmos (i.e., there is no cosmogony); that teotl is self-ordering and self-arranging; that the unity is the self-presentation -- not self-representation -- of teotl; that reality is sacred because teotl is sacred; and that teotl lacks intentional states (79-80). In short, Maffie's interpretation of Aztec religion is an extension of his first two theses aimed in part at distinguishing Aztec thought both from familiar moves in the Western tradition and from standard interpretations of Aztec religion. For example, Maffie argues that the Aztecs did not, pace León-Portilla, adopt many of the dichotomies that pervade Western religions and metaphysics (e.g., sacred/profane, natural/supernatural, or immanent/transcendent), nor did they endorse metaphysical hierarchies akin to what Arthur Lovejoy called the "great chain of being."

The third overarching thesis of the book, repeated throughout the text but not fully developed until chapter eight, is that weaving is the root metaphor of Aztec thought, and that the cosmos is a grand weaving-in-progress. However, to fully appreciate the explanatory power of the metaphor, one needs to understand first the dynamics of teotl. What, in other words, are the hows or modi operandi of teotl? As this is the subject of chapters 3-7, the bulk of the book, which contains numerous complex and interweaving arguments, not to mention more ethnographic information than I could possibly hope to convey, I must limit myself to the barest of summaries.

In chapter three Maffie introduces the "fundamental premise" of Aztec metaphysics, which he calls inamic agonistic unity. Teotl, Maffie claims, is defined by

the continual and continuous cyclical struggle (agon) of paired opposites, polarities, or dualities. Agonistic inamic unity refers to a brute fact about the nature of teotl and hence a brute fact about the nature of reality per se. . . . Teotl's ceaseless self-becoming, self-presenting, and self-unfolding, and therefore its ceaseless generating and regenerating of the cosmos, are defined by agonistic inamic unity. (137)

Night and day, male and female, life and death, warp and weft, wind and fire, wet and dry, flower and flint stone, weakness and strength, order and disorder or being and non-being are just a few of the countless opposites that struggle for dominance. Indeed, all things, processes, forces, powers, influences, or energies-in-motion have an inamic match that they complete, complement, and compete with. More accurately, all things have multiple matches, which indicates one of the ways in which teotl is ineliminably ambiguous. For example, a person is both male (vis-à-vis his wife) and female (vis-à-vis his enemy), both dead and alive, both weak and strong, etc. Importantly, no inamic half ever triumphs over the other, for both opposites are necessary for the existence of the pair. There is no death without life, for instance, even though death and life constantly struggle to dominate each other.

If inamic agonistic unity is "metaphysical bedrock" concerning the how of teotl, as Maffie describes it toward the end of his book (425), there must be less fundamental ways of characterizing how teotl transforms itself into the plurality and complexity of human experience. So, in chapters 4-6, Maffie develops his account of the three distinct patterns according to which agonistic inamic forces complement, compete with, and complete one another -- what Maffie calls olin, malinalli, and nepantla motion-change, respectively. Each kind of motion-change occupies one chapter in which Maffie marshals a wealth of linguistic, literary, and graphic evidence to help the reader grasp the essence of each (or better, to see the Wittgensteinian family resemblance). However, here I'll restrict myself to a few general observations that apply to all three.

First, Maffie does not attempt to define each kind of motion-change, since, he argues, change in Aztec thought is a species of motion (hence the hyphenated "motion-change"); motion-change is both qualitative and quantitative; and the three kinds of motion-change apply to all that exists. So, although olin motion-change refers to bouncing, oscillating, pulsating, centering, curving, rounding, or undulating (quantitative change), which characterize the "shape" of rubber, bouncing balls, a version of proto-soccer, pulsating hearts, pregnancy, the four cardinal directions, the four stages of life, the flapping of butterfly wings, how victims were stretched out before being sacrificed, the motion of the rising and setting sun, the nature of chance (just to name a few of the instantiations of olin), it also characterizes more abstractly the shape of cyclical completion, renewal, life-giving, and ultimately the "biorhythm" of the Fifth Sun.[1] "In short," Maffie says, "olin defines the shape of coming-into-life, of cyclical completion, of life energy generally. Indeed, it defines the shape of life or living per se" (190, italics in the original). So, rather than attempt to define the essence of olin motion-change, Maffie opts for a kind of linguistic, literary, and graphic analysis to get us to see what he sees.

Second, each kind of motion-change is descriptive, practical, and normative. For instance, while malinalli motion-change refers to spinning, twisting, gyrating, spiraling, revolving, and whirling, which characterize making rope, braiding hair, sweeping, cooking and digesting (descriptive), it also provides humans with a manner of capturing cosmic power in the form of sweeping (for instance), which enables them to rid their environment of the forces of tlazoli, i.e. "that which is worn out, rotten, decomposed, deranged, disordered, and decayed such as excrement, vomit, dirt, muck, rags, and random bits of straw or hair -- in short stuff out of place" (280). In other words, for the Aztecs, quotidian activities such as braiding one's hair or sweeping one's porch, given their "shape," were thought of less as chores and more as ways of causally participating in the transformation of teotl. Moreover, one such way they participated, human sacrifice, was thought of as a malinalli-activity that allowed humans to feed the universe, which in turn fed them. And so, Maffie claims, this malinalli-defined ritual "was a key component in the Aztecs' ethics of reciprocity and well balanced-ness" (277).

Third, the principle patterns of teotl's becoming and transforming -- and thus the nature of reality itself -- are ineliminably ambiguous, a point that is illustrated clearly by nepantla, the subject of chapter 6. Nepantla, which is "cosmologically primordial and metaphysically fundamental" (480), is defined broadly as middling or balancing, as well as weaving, intersecting, joining, juxtaposing, or superimposing. It characterizes, for example, the middling (adverb) aspect of walking whereby a pedestrian achieves balance between two alternative imbalances (left step and right step), or the middling aspect of a weaver's warp and weft that holds previously loose, chaotic threads in dynamic, orderly tension. Nepantla-processes are ontologically ambiguous both because they occur "in the middle" and because they are creative and destructive. So, for the Aztecs, the confluence of two rivers, the joining of man and wife (sexual intercourse), or a crossroads is a "middling" that signals the destruction of two separate things and the creation a third thing. That is, nepantla middling is both destructive and creative. However, it does not signal the complete destruction of the old or complete creation of the new; instead, it indicates the middle in between old and new that is neither. Nepantla-processes (and "things") are "neither-fish-nor-fowly."

Of the three kinds of motion-change, nepantla is the most basic. Maffie says it defines "the basic working of the cosmos" (371). This is due in part to the fact that nepantla-processes such as war, sexual intercourse, and weaving represent the shape of unifying partners in agonistic struggle, which all things participate in ("metaphysical bedrock"). Nepantla motion-change even "weaves together malinalli and olin to form the fabric of the Fifth Age" (482). And it is due in part to the fact that, as mentioned earlier, weaving is the principle organizing metaphor of Aztec thought (the third thesis). Thus, in the eighth and final chapter, Maffie fleshes out the analogy to show that, indeed, the cosmos is a grand weaving-in-progress or grand nepantla-process. To that end, providing a detailed examination of the elements and processes of backstrap weaving, complete with diagrams, Maffie argues that there is a nearly isomorphic relationship between the elements and processes of weaving and the various aspects and hows of teotl's self-unfolding, as developed in the previous chapters. It is an impressively coherent and intricate comparison, and this reader was convinced that nepantla motion-change, and weaving in particular, is indeed the "'unifying nucleus' of the Aztecs' cosmovisión" (510).

Unfortunately, in a brief summary, one is forced to leave out more than one can include. I do not have the space, for instance, to discuss Maffie's wonderful chapter on space and time, what Maffie calls "time-place." But the same lessons apply. Like olin, malinalli, and nepantla, "Time-place is an aspect of the becoming and unfolding of teotl. Time-place is how teotl moves. It is immanent within the unfolding patterns and rhythms in the becoming of the cosmos" (422). Nor do I have the space to reprise the many arguments for Maffie's revisionary interpretations of Aztec views about cosmogony -- or rather "acosmogony" -- eschatology, or truth. Instead, I hope to have conveyed the magnitude, scope, and coherence of Maffie's examination of Aztec philosophy.

Without a background in Mesoamerican studies, it is hard to find fault with Maffie's evidence for specific conclusions. However, I do have two related reservations (not quite criticisms) after reading the book. The first is that it is difficult to tell whether it is a "reconstruction" of Aztec philosophy, as it was meant to be, or a construction. In other words, although Maffie lays out what his criteria for a successful reconstruction are -- empirical adequacy, conservatism, simplicity, internal coherence, unification, fecundity, and explanatory power (11) -- and is successful by those criteria, it remains unclear to me whether Aztec philosophers were themselves conscious of the coherence and systematicity of their worldview as Maffie fleshes it out. There is no question after reading Aztec Philosophy that such a worldview can be found in the Náhuatl language and other products of Aztec culture; but I wonder how close the Aztecs got to this worldview themselves.

A second reservation concerns the status of Aztec thought as philosophy. Throughout the text, Maffie offers mounds of linguistic, literary, and graphic evidence for his interpretation of Aztec metaphysics, but the text is short on evidence that the Aztecs would have offered in favor of their views. The worry here, again, is that it is unclear whom we ought to attribute these views to, and perhaps more worrisome, how we are supposed to apply them to our own metaphysics. Perhaps the first worry is moot since León-Portilla may be correct in saying that "the elaboration of Nahuatl philosophy, as in the case of Hindu philosophy contained in the Upanishads, cannot be attributed to isolated thinkers but to ancient schools directed by the wise men."[2] However, I suspect that many contemporary philosophers, especially those who aren't already sympathetic to the aims of comparative philosophy, will want to hear more about why the Aztecs believed what they did, not just that they did.

Of course these kinds of reservations are just those that some have about comparative philosophy, as well as the history of philosophy, in general. But the worry in this case is especially acute since, as Maffie acknowledges in his introduction, one of the main questions hovering above a study of this kind is whether the Aztecs "did philosophy." That is, while no one doubts that the Aztecs "had a philosophy" in the sense of having a worldview, cosmovisión, or Weltanschauung (5), skeptics doubt that they also critically and consciously examined the adequacy of their worldview, whether they were skeptical of traditional and customary knowledge, whether they themselves sought systematicity in their worldview, or whether they, to borrow a phrase from León-Portilla, aspired "to reach out from the world of illusion in search of rational explanation."[3]

And it is an important question because philosophers from Sepúlveda, Hegel, Husserl, to Rorty (to name a few of the most notorious) have doubted whether non-Western peoples, specifically indigenous groups, are capable of philosophizing, and because there is a strong connection between the Eurocentric history of philosophy and political oppression.[4] As Maffie observes:

As countless scholars have argued, philosophy plays a vital role in the modern West's conception of itself and of the non-Western Other. What is at stake here is nothing less than the modern West's self-image as rational, self-conscious, civilized, cultured, human, disciplined, modern, and masculine in contrast with the non-West as irrational, appetitive, emotional, instinctive, uncivilized, savage, primitive, nonhuman, undisciplined, backward, feminine, and closer to nature. . . . Western culture's philosophy versus nonphilosophy binary is thus a social-historical tool constructed to celebrate and legitimize the West and its imperial hegemony while at the same time denigrating 'the Rest' and legitimizing its heteronomy. (6)

And so, while I am convinced that reconstructing Aztec metaphysics, as Maffie has so gracefully done here, indirectly shows that Sepúlveda, Hegel, Husserl, and Rorty, among others, were simply wrong, it would also help to show, if the source material allows, what counted as philosophizing (verb) in Aztec life.

I suspect that Maffie doesn't say more about whether the Aztecs did philosophy since for him -- as for me -- there is no doubt that they did. How else could a culture have produced such an intricate, systematic, and coherent worldview? And I am sure that Aztec Philosophy is his attempt to de-center the question, not just convince philosophers in the Western tradition. So, perhaps Maffie doesn't say more about whether the Aztecs philosophized since part of his aim, like all good comparative philosophers, is to encourage us to suspend our conceptions of philosophy until we take seriously those outside our own tradition. In any case, the practice of comparative philosophy is not possible without the resources to study different philosophies. In this respect, Maffie has done us all a great service. His book is not only a landmark contribution to comparative philosophy, which cuts across multiple disciplines and multiple philosophies -- there are more than 1800 footnotes, a massive number for a philosophy text -- but I suspect that it is also a landmark contribution to philosophy, insofar as it provides us with a necessary resource to start questioning whether there is a difference between philosophy and comparative philosophy.

[1] The Aztecs believed that humans inhabit the fifth cosmic age or "Sun," which was preceded by four other cosmic ages, and which will eventually be destroyed by a big earthquake. This is the world as we experience it (i.e., defined by the motion of the sun) but is not identical to teotl, as teotl has survived and will survive all ages.

[2] Miguel León-Portilla, Aztec Thought and Culture: A Study of the Ancient Nahuatl Mind (Norman, OK: University of Oklahoma Press, 1963), 23.

[3] Ibid., 71.

[4] In his introduction, Maffie notes that Edmund Husserl claimed "that the expression Western Philosophy is tautologous while the expression non-Western philosophy is oxymoronic; that Emmanuel Levinas claimed that "I always say -- but in private -- that the Greeks and the Bible are all that is serious in humanity. Everything else is dancing"; and that Richard Rorty claimed that "looking for philosophy outside the West is 'pointless' since philosophy is unique to the Western culture" (5). Of course, this attitude is nothing new. As Peter K. J. Park argues in Africa, Asia, and the History of Philosophy: Racism in the Formation of the Philosophical Canon, 1780-1830, this dismissive attitude toward non-Western philosophies can be traced to German historians of philosophy in the late 18th and 19th centuries. And, as I would argue, it can be traced back even further to the conquest itself, as is seen in the Great Debate at Valladolid in 1550-1551, when King Charles V summoned a "Council of Fourteen" to hear the cases of Juan Ginés Sepúlveda, an Aristotle scholar, and Bartolomé de Las Casas, the famous "defender of the Indians," to decide once and for all whether the natives in New Spain were fully rational or whether they were "natural slaves," according to Aristotle's theory of natural slavery and its subsequent Christianization. Although the Spanish theologians didn't ask whether the Aztecs possessed a philosophy per se -- to expect that they might have is a kind of anachronism -- they all but asked it. For a nice overview of the debate and its racial and political implications, see Lewis Hanke, Aristotle and the American Indians: A Study in Race Prejudice in the Modern World (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1975).