Backsliding: Understanding Weakness of Will

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Alfred R. Mele, Backsliding: Understanding Weakness of Will, Oxford University Press, 2012, 145pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199896134.

Reviewed by Neil Levy, Florey Neuroscience Institutes, The University of Melbourne


For the past 25 years, Al Mele's work has been a central reference point for philosophers working in moral psychology and (more recently) free will. Mele's work is incremental: his eight books and near 200 hundred papers elaborate, develop and extend positions, many of which he first staked out in the 1980s. In this, his most recent book, he returns to ground first covered in detail in 1987's Irrationality: the existence and explanation of weak-willed action, understood as free intentional action that conflicts with an agent's occurrent judgment at the time of the action.

Weakness of will is puzzling, for reasons that Mele brings out. His focus is on the most puzzling cases: in what he describes as core weak-willed actions, sane and nondepressed agents freely and intentionally act in ways that, as they know, conflict with judgments they have previously made. For instance, Jack (one of the agents featuring in Mele's many cases) intentionally goes to a party, because he expects the party to be fun, even though he has previously formed a judgment that he ought to stay home and study, and he has formed this judgment taking into account that he expects the party to be fun. Given that Jack has not learned anything new, given, further, that Jack has not changed his mind about what it would be best to do, how do we explain Jack's freely and intentionally acting contrary to his judgment?

Mele's first order of business is defending the claim that actions like Jack's are appropriately described as weak-willed. Richard Holton (2009) claims that weakness of the will properly refers to actions that conflict with an agent's resolutions or intentions, rather than actions that conflict with her considered judgments (Holton reserves the Greek term akrasia, treated by most other philosophers as a synonym for weakness of will, for the latter). For Holton, weakness of will involves the too ready inclination to revise one's resolutions. Mele is unconvinced. Much of his argument against Holton is based on studies he conducted with philosophically naïve subjects. Cutting a relatively brief story even shorter, the evidence seems to indicate that Mele's subjects were significantly more likely to identify weakness with actions contrary to one's judgments than with those contrary to a resolution, though a minority of subjects does seem to be tempted by Holton's view. Holton may respond that Mele's subjects confuse weakness of will with akrasia; further, he may adduce cases in which agents apparently display strength of will in acting against their own judgments (since, intuitively, it may take great self-control to act against one's own settled judgments). To these points Mele has replies.

Rather than attempt to adjudicate this debate, however, I want to ask why it matters at all. Clearly there are two conceptually distinct phenomena here. It is clear that some cases which involve loss of self-control feature agents who form prior intentions or resolutions to resist a temptation (say) and some do not. These two phenomena are worth distinguishing, and may involve distinct psychological mechanisms. So far as I can tell, nothing in Mele's claims against Holton bears on what the explanation of these two phenomena might be. The dispute seems therefore to be terminological, boiling down to which of these two phenomena the folk call weakness of the will. Perhaps some readers will find that question interesting, but it is surely peripheral to the questions that are ostensibly Mele's concerns in this book: does weakness of will (understood as he defines it) exist and how is it possible?

Mele's second goal is to take on skepticism with regard to weakness of will. Mele seems to think that the experience of weakness of will is so compelling that skeptics have the burden of proof. Rather than offer a positive case for the existence of weakness of will, he takes on two of the best known arguments that attempt to shoulder that burden. One argument turns on the claim that the judgment that I ought to A is conceptually sufficient for intending to A, such that a failure to A is evidence for an inability to A. Against this claim, Mele adduces the existence of drug addicts and sufferers from compulsions. It certainly seems to be the case that these agents (sometimes) judge that they ought to refrain from taking drugs or acting on their compulsions and yet intentionally take drugs or act on their compulsions.

The other argument (the well-known basis for Gary Watson's (1977) skepticism with regard to weakness of will) turns on a related claim, that any explanation for an agent's failure to resist a temptation which does not cite their inability to resist must cite the agent's changing their judgments. Mele's strategy in response to Watson's case for skepticism is to present us with cases and to ask whether it is plausible to think that the agents who feature in them form a new, contrary, judgment. For my own part, I don't know what to say about these cases. I can tell a coherent Watson-style story about them and a coherent Mele-style story, and I see little reason to choose between them. However, we might be able to make progress by going beyond intuition pumps and vignettes. Elsewhere (Levy 2011) I have argued that the empirical evidence supports a view on which actions contrary to agents' prior intentions (and, apparently, judgments) are preceded by changes in occurrent judgments. We give ourselves permission to indulge, just this one time, or otherwise rationalize the action. On this view, though we retain a judgment that there is a decisive reason to refrain from doing what we are doing, nevertheless we also form a contradictory judgment that somehow rationalizes the action. Though the evidence that supports this view cannot reasonably be held to be conclusive, it seems that we might make more progress taking it into account, rather than simply relying on intuitions that appear to differ from philosopher to philosopher.

There is another reason to think that accounts that distinguish two judgments, with different and opposing contents (of which there is a long and distinguished history in discussions of weakness of will, dating back to Aristotle) are to be preferred to single judgment accounts. This reason is best brought out by considering Mele's own story of how weakness of will occurs. In brief, it runs as follows. Normal human agents are set up so that there is a default route from our judging that it is best to A to acquiring an intention to A. Our judgment about what it is best to do is based at least in part on our evaluation of the objects of our desires. Sometimes, however, the motivational strength of a desire is out of step with the evaluation of its object (because our better judgments are more sensitive to the informational dimension of representations than to their motivational dimension; Mele supports this claim with a brief survey of empirical evidence). In cases like this we may be more strongly motivated to act in a way inconsistent with our evaluations than consistently with them; in these cases, an exercise of self-control is called for. By exercising self-control, we may be able to cause ourselves to act in ways consistent with our evaluations; sometimes, however, we fail to exercise self-control, or our exercise of self-control is insufficient to cause us to act as we judge we ought. If we continue to judge that it is better to A than B, but we intentionally B because we are more strongly motivated to B than A, and other things are equal, we are victims of weakness of will.

The story Mele tells is compelling, buttressed not only by everyday experience but also by empirical evidence concerning both the determinants of motivational strength and the existence of a capacity for self-control. However, it is worth pointing out that it leaves a great deal mysterious. Suppose Jack judges he ought to A, but because he is more strongly motivated to B, he B's, while retaining the judgment that he ought to A and while believing that B-ing is inconsistent with A-ing. Does Jack experience himself as dragged kicking and screaming to B? Does he experience B-ing as somehow alien to him? Everyday experience, and the empirical evidence Mele cites seems to indicate that the answer to these questions is no. But this seems to require explanation. Why is Jack's judgment passive with regard to his action, without Jack (whose all things considered judgment it is) being passive with regard to his action? Notice that a two judgment story nicely fills the gap here: Jack is not alienated from his action because he takes himself to act as he thinks he ought.

Following tradition, Mele identifies core weak-willed actions with free intentional actions that conflict with agents' better judgments. Much of Backsliding is therefore devoted to the claim that weak-willed actions are free. Notice, however, that there is an interesting question which might be the subject of philosophical investigation even if we drop, or leave open, the claim that weak-willed actions are free. It seems to me at least nearly as interesting to discover how it is that sane agents can intentionally act against their own better judgments as it is to discover how these acts might qualify as free. Indeed, there are good reasons to think that the class of actions in which Mele is most interested is wider than the class that many philosophers would consider free. Mele argues convincingly that in many cases in which agents are motivated to act contrary to their own best judgments, they can exercise self-control (perhaps by redirecting their attention). However he does not argue, and does not appear to believe, that in all the cases he would be willing to describe as involving weakness of will the agent could successfully have exercised self-control. Should such actions nevertheless be described as free? Different philosophers would take different views on this question.

It may be that Mele takes his account of how weak-willed actions differ from compelled actions to give us good reason to regard the former as free. Mele argues persuasively that agents we would be disposed to call weak-willed would act in accordance with their better judgment in response to less dramatic incentives than the incentives required to motivate agents we describe as compelled. But it is one thing to argue for this difference between compulsion and weak-willed actions, and another to argue for the claim that weak-willed acts, unlike compelled, are (sometimes) free. It is true that the worlds in which I lift 120 pounds above my head are closer to this world, and perhaps more numerous, than those in which I lift 200 pounds above my head. But it does not follow that my failure to lift 120 pounds above my head in this world is something I do freely, or even more freely, than my failure with regard to 200 pounds. In some cases in which I fail to act as I judge I ought, I might have acted as I judge I ought in this very world (questions about determinism and access to worlds other than the actual world aside): I might have exercised self-control. But as we saw above, not all cases in which I am (apparently) subject to weakness of will are cases in which I might successfully have exercised self-control.

There is therefore, I think, a case for investigating weakness of will without worrying about whether such actions are free. There is also a case for investigating further the content of the judgments that weak-willed agents form. In pursuing these further investigations, Backsliding -- alongside Mele's previous books -- will be an indispensable guide. His account of the psychological processes involved in acting against one's better judgments, and of how self-control can nevertheless sometimes be exercised, remains the most plausible available, and can survive the revisions suggested, if indeed these revisions stand up to investigation.


Holton, Richard. 2009. Willing, Wanting, Waiting. New York: Oxford University Press.

Levy, Neil. 2011. Resisting 'Weakness of the Will'. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 82: 134-155.

Watson, Gary. 1977. Skepticism about Weakness of Will. Philosophical Review 86: 316-339.