Bad Words: Philosophical Perspectives on Slurs

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David Sosa (ed.), Bad Words: Philosophical Perspectives on Slurs, Oxford University Press, 2018, 235pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198758655.

Reviewed by Ralph DiFranco, Auburn University


Over the last decade, pejorative language has emerged as one of the most popular topics in the philosophy of language. David Sosa's book is a collection of papers by major players in the field. Several of the chapters are devoted to refining and defending views an author had previously advanced in print, though some entries explore uncharted territory. Topics under discussion include the process by which a slur is appropriated by its target group, whether a slurring word and its neutral counterpart term encode the same semantic content, and the nature of slurs' derogatory power, specifically their capacity to express derogatory attitudes and harm their targets. In what follows I canvass several papers, raise a few challenges to the views defended therein, and point out some shortcomings and virtues of the collection as a whole.

"Calling, Addressing, and Appropriation" by Luvell Anderson, gives an account of the appropriation or reclamation of slurs. As Anderson observes, non-derogatory appropriated uses of slurs are often limited to specific sub-communities within a larger speech community. For instance, within the broader community of American English speakers, African Americans responded to oppressive conditions by using a tool of racial oppression, 'nigger', in a non-pejorative way. Anderson suggests that speakers who use the appropriated form of this slur perform a distinctive illocutionary act, addressing, a positive or neutral act that he contrasts with calling, which "functions in a way that signals distance from the referential target" (p. 24). Anderson holds that the former speech act requires membership in the community that constitutes the slur's target group in order to be performed felicitously.

It is not clear that Anderson's account extends to all reclaimed slurs. For instance, he does not mention 'queer', which (unlike the n-word) admits of non-derogatory uses by people who are not members of the target group, i.e., the LGBTQ+ community. Seemingly, cisgender heterosexual speakers can use 'queer' to address LGBTQ+ people, as in 'Naomi is the first queer woman to be hired by the department' (see also academic uses like 'queer studies' and queer theory'). As with slurs appropriated by other groups, endearing and neutral uses of this label within the LGBTQ+ community arose as a response to oppressive conditions. So, one issue left unexplored by Anderson is why the restrictions on appropriated uses seem to differ among different slurs.

Elisabeth Camp's "A Dual Act Analysis of Slurs" builds on previous work in which she develops the notion of a derogatory perspective, i.e., a mode of interpretation that structures one's "thoughts in an intuitive, holistic way without necessarily committing [one] to any particular proposition, emotion, or evaluation" (p. 50). On Camp's view, utterances of slurs "contribute both a descriptive and a (broadly) expressive, perspectival element to the conversation" (p. 48). The speaker who uses a slur signals endorsement of a derogatory perspective on the target group. Often the at-issue content of a slurring utterance is exhausted by a predication of group membership, while endorsement of the perspective is added to the conversational record, yet in some cases the perspectival element is part or all of the at-issue content (p. 50).

It is not entirely clear what endorsement is for Camp. At times she describes slurs' other contribution as involving "commitment to the appropriateness of a derogating perspective on the targeted group" (p. 50). Camp also claims that when one speaker reports on another's utterance, the "reporting speaker's failure to strongly distance themselves from the perspective often constitutes positive evidence of endorsement," even when the speaker is directly quoting someone else (p. 52). Seemingly, merely providing evidence of one's endorsement of a perspective P is distinct from endorsing P. Perhaps endorsement of P involves commitment to acting in accordance with P, some sort of "walking the walk" in addition to "talking the talk." Another issue Camp leaves unaddressed is whether endorsement requires reflection on the part of the speaker who uses a slur. Must they consciously endorse the associated perspective? Is endorsement something the speaker may disavow consistently and in good faith upon reflection?

Robin Jeshion, in "Slurs, Dehumanization, and the Expression of Contempt," argues that slurs are derogatory in virtue of expressing contempt for their targets. She introduces the notions of dehumanizing thought and dehumanizing action. Both admit of strong and weak versions. Dehumanizing thought in the weak sense is a matter of "conceiving of humans or human groups as inferior qua persons; conceiving humans or human groups as unworthy of equal standing or full respect as persons" (p. 79). Dehumanizing thought in the strong sense is a matter of "conceiving of humans or human groups as less than human" (p. 79). Both notions correspond to weak and strong dehumanizing acts. Weak dehumanizing acts consist of treating humans as inferior qua persons, as unworthy of equal standing or full respect as persons, whereas strong dehumanizing acts consist of treating people as less than human (p. 79). For Jeshion, slurs dehumanize in the sense that they express at least a weak dehumanizing thought -- contempt for the target -- and utterances of slurs constitute weak dehumanizing acts. For her, contempt is directed at the whole person, and is "rooted in perceived enduring character-defining traits" (p. 93).

We might question whether Jeshion needs to appeal to dehumanization in her theory of slurs. Why not instead use a more familiar label, 'derogatory', for thoughts and actions that deny people equal standing and full respect as persons, and reserve 'dehumanizing' for thoughts and actions that deny a person or group their humanity? It is not clear that any explanatory advantage is gained by distinguishing strong and weak dehumanization. Setting aside terminology, it would seem that slurs like 'yuppie' and 'ivory tower dweller' pose a problem for Jeshion. On her definition, slurs include derogatory words that target people on the basis of their profession (p. 81). Given that transient labels like 'yuppie' no longer apply once one changes one's profession, it would seem strange to regard a person's profession as a fundamental, enduring, character-defining feature. So, pace Jeshion, it is doubtful that all slurs derogate people on the basis of such perceived features.

Two chapters, "Loaded Words: On the Semantics and Pragmatics of Slurs" by Kent Bach, and "Pejoratives as Fiction" by Christopher Hom and Robert May, defend semantic theories. According to Bach's loaded descriptivism, a slur has two components of descriptive meaning: the same content as its neutral counterpart, as well as a generic side comment that attributes a negative evaluative property to members of the target group indiscriminately (p. 63). Bach is not clear on what he takes this property to be, suggesting it should be broad enough to be compatible with a wide range of negative evaluative properties. Similarly, Hom and May hold that

pejoratives express a semantic component that is represented as PEJ that is a second-level concept that takes first-level group concepts (e.g. being Jewish, being Chinese, being African American, etc.) as inputs and maps them to first-level concepts (e.g., being a kike, being a nigger, being a chink, etc.). (p. 112)

PEJ(Jew), for instance, yields as an output the concept ought to be the target of negative moral evaluation because of being Jewish.

One objection to semantic theories, raised by Geoffrey K. Pullum, is the "problem of unwanted tautologousness" (p. 183). Given a truth-conditional semantic approach like Bach's or Hom and May's, 'Dykes are contemptible because they're grossly immoral' would be trivial, but a homophobe would take it to be true, informative, and not redundant (p. 183). Pullum takes this feature of slurs as evidence that the derogatory aspect of their meaning cannot be given in a specification of their literal meaning (p. 185).

Bach anticipates a similar objection. He suggests that slurs, being lexical items designed to convey "what a speaker would otherwise need extra verbiage to convey" gives the expression of that content "extra force" (p. 73). This feature of slurs explains why 'Sandy is a wop' strikes us as different from 'Sandy is Italian, and therefore contemptible'. But Bach does not elaborate on what this extra force amounts to. Moreover, it is not clear that lexicalization of the sort Bach describes always has the effect of increasing the rhetorical force of an utterance. Claiming that George is 'messy', for instance, actually seems less derogatory than spelling out the properties George has that supposedly warrant this label ('George does not clean up after himself, he's covered in filth' and so on).

Other theories hold that slurs are offensive and derogatory in virtue of something other than their content. These include Ernie Lepore and Matthew Stone's "Pejorative Tone" and Pullum's "Slurs and Obscenities: Lexicography, Semantics, and Philosophy". Here I focus on Lepore and Stone, who hold that a slur's rhetorical power is due to its tone, i.e., its characteristic interpretive effects, including imagery, emotions, and experiences of the sort that metaphor and poetic utterances characteristically evoke. A slur's tone is not part of its conventional meaning in any sense.

One question for Lepore and Stone is whether a slur's semantics place any constraints on its tone. They hold that tone is not determined by a linguistic rule, as in charged phrases like 'Oops!' and 'Ouch!' (p. 143), and emphasize the open-endedness in the evocative imagery of slurs. Lepore and Stone's account is in some ways an elaboration of Frege's theory of coloring, which is not objective and must be evoked by the individual hearer (p. 149). In comparison, content is publicly available.

It is implausible that the interpretive effects of slurs are entirely open-ended. There do seem to be constraints on how one should interpret a slur, and a slur's content may be one source of these constraints. Thus, the denial that semantics has any role to play in the derogatory power of slurs seems implausible. Compare a slur like 'slanty-eyed' to 'wop'. Let us suppose that Lepore and Stone are correct in holding that what makes these slurs so offensive and derogatory is that their interpretation standardly evokes imagistic or experiential effects. Seemingly, the semantic content of the former slur places constraints on the imaginative exercise hearers are to undertake in order to get its characteristic rhetorical effects (specifically, we are to form a visual image of the target's eyes). In the case of the latter slur, it is not clear what kind of imagery, emotion, or experiential state hearers are to construct. Perhaps many different images would suffice (one could form a caricatured image of an Italian person based on a violent mobster character from the TV series The Sopranos or an image of a cast member from the series Jersey Shore who sports gold jewelry, a muscle shirt, and a blowout hairstyle). Nevertheless, there are some constraints on this imaginative exercise. Suppose that in interpreting the phrase 'wop' I imagined a stereotypical 18th century English aristocrat wearing a large wig with white curls, an elaborately embroidered coat, and so on. Given that I am competent with the slur and I have not misheard the speaker (I am not confusing 'wop' and 'fop'), I've failed to do the requisite imagining.

Despite its many excellent contributions, one unfortunate feature of the collection is its narrow focus on linguistic phenomena (this is understandable, given that the title is Bad Words). Yet it seems that many slurs are non-verbal. Take, for instance, a racist impression in which one utters gibberish that purports to mimic Chinese speakers. Also consider gestural slurs (imagine someone pulling the skin near their eyes outward to slur people of East Asian ancestry). Should an account of verbal slurs extend to cover examples like these? Perhaps these non-verbal slurs promulgate a derogatory perspective, and some may dehumanize their targets. However, it is not clear that semantic approaches can extend to cover non-verbal cases.

It is doubtful that Blackface minstrel theater, for instance, encodes the proposition that Black people ought to be subject to negative moral evaluation. Lepore and Stone do mention non-verbal evocative symbols, like the swastika and burning crosses (pp. 137-8). They suggest that while these symbols are often treated differently than words, their effects also "involve a mix of expectations, connotations, associations, analogies, and more" (p. 138). Thus, "we should not be surprised if what makes some slurs objectionable is something other than their linguistic meaning" (ibid.). Here non-verbal pejoratives are mentioned only as analogues to the target phenomena, words, and are given as a challenge to semantic theories. One question for future work on slurs is whether there are differences in the meaning and rhetorical effects of iconic slurs (including slurs that present an image that disparages the target, such as blackface minstrelsy), emblematic slurs, i.e., derogatory symbols that do not purport to depict their targets (e.g., displays of the swastika), and verbal slurs, i.e., lexical items that are the focus of the book. For instance, does a racist impression or caricature of a Chinese person slur its target in the same way that 'chink' does? Does spray-painting a swastika on the side of a synagogue slur Jewish people in the same way that uses of 'kike' slur them?

Setting aside its somewhat narrow focus, the book is a valuable resource for readers who want to become informed about some of the most popular and widely discussed positions among philosophers of language on the semantics and pragmatics of words that are slurs.