Badiou and Hegel: Infinity, Dialectics, Subjectivity

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Jim Vernon and Antonio Calcagno (eds.), Badiou and Hegel: Infinity, Dialectics, Subjectivity, Lexington Books, 2015, 232pp, $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739199893.

Reviewed by Adrian Johnston, University of New Mexico


From its beginnings, Alain Badiou's corpus contains recurrent engagements with G.W.F. Hegel's philosophy and its legacy. Such early works of the 1970s and 1980s as Theory of Contradiction, The Rational Kernel of the Hegelian Dialectic, and Theory of the Subject feature Marxist (specifically Maoist) revisitations of Hegelian speculative dialectics in which antagonisms, destruction, splitting, and volatility are emphasized and valorized over reconciliations, syntheses, unifications, and stability. The system of the "mature" Badiou, starting with his 1988 magnum opus Being and Event, seems to shift towards a more critical stance vis-à-vis Hegel. The essays in Jim Vernon and Antonio Calcagno's timely collection cover the multiple facets of Badiou's highly ambivalent rapport with Hegel's philosophy as it unfolds from the 1970s through today.

A. J. Bartlett and Justin Clemens's "Measuring Up: Some Consequences of Badiou's Confrontation with Hegel" is well positioned at the start of this volume by virtue of its furnishing a helpful, even-handed overview of the history of Badiou's exchanges with Hegel across the arc of his intellectual itinerary. Furthermore, Bartlett and Clemens clearly explain why and how Badiou's recasting of ontology via set theory (according to the axioms of Zermelo-Fraenkel plus the axiom of choice [ZFC]) brings him into conflict with notions of infinity and totality associated with Hegel's "absolute idealism."

The immediately following essay, Tzuchien Tho's "The Good, the Bad, and the Indeterminate: Hegel and Badiou on the Dialectics of the Infinite," complements and buttresses these aspects of Bartlett and Clemens's contribution.  Tho valuably situates Badiou's mathematical "meta-ontology" in the larger sweep of the history of mathematics. In so doing, he nicely illustrates the philosophical stakes of developments in mathematics post-dating Hegel's death, thus leading to the observation that, "The natural 'Badiouian' question for Hegel . . . is whether developments within mathematics itself would be able to reconfigure the state of the relation between mathematics and philosophy as he found it, in the early nineteenth century" (p. 41). Tho, along with some of the other contributors, asks whether Hegel's dismissal of mathematics as mechanically unthinking and constitutively incapable of grappling with the categories and concepts dealt with by dialectical speculation is a verdict that should hold in light of developments in mathematics over the course of the last two centuries.

Bartlett and Clemens as well as Tho appropriately devote portions of their reflections to Hegel's notorious distinction between the good/genuine and the bad/spurious infinite. As per the delineation of this distinction in Hegelian Logic and Badiou's critique of this delineation, Bartlett, Clemens, and Tho (plus certain others in this volume) link good/genuine infinity to the idea of totality qua the One-All of a Set of all sets. However, Tho himself at one point stipulates that, "we are only speaking of the mathematical infinite rather than its metaphysical or theological cousins" (p. 43). This admission can be taken, perhaps against Tho's intentions, as prompting queries that cast the shadows of some doubts over the Badiouian staging of a confrontation between a mathematical meta-ontology and Hegel's non-mathematical, dialectical-speculative Logic. Insofar as Hegel's good/genuine infinite is put forward as different-in-kind from any infinity à la mathematics, is it and/or ought it to be susceptible to the implications of specifically mathematical meditations on the infinite?

Both to put a sharper point on the preceding skeptical question as well as to segue to a treatment of the third chapter, the definitive articulation of the difference between good/genuine and bad/spurious infinity in the Science of Logic is supplemented by an immediately following "remark" (Anmerkung) on the topic of "idealism." Therein, Hegel specifies that, for absolute idealism's realism of the good/genuine infinite, everything is what it is only in and through its relations with other things. That is to say, Hegel's absolute idealism of good/genuine infinity is tantamount to the organic holism of a relational realist ontology. The Badiouians of Badiou and Hegel evidently assume that Hegel's holism is equivalent to, so to speak, "wholism," namely, the ontological positing of a Whole (i.e., the totality of a One-All forbidden by ZFC). Yet, one might wonder: Does insisting upon an organic-style pervasive interrelatedness necessarily entail totalization in the manner objected to by Badiou and his followers?

The issues I have just raised are directly relevant to the third chapter, Adriel M. Trott's "Badiou contra Hegel: The Materialist Dialectic Against the Myth of the Whole." Echoing the Badiou who himself echoes certain deeply-entrenched, twentieth-century Continental complaints about Hegel, Trott depicts Hegel's philosophy as a totalizing (and, perhaps, even totalitarian) thinking of self-identical oneness -- and this by contrast with the detotalized multiplicities of Badiou's set-theoretic (meta-)ontology. Relatedly, for Trott, Badiou, with his emphases on the destructive forces of real negativities, is an inheritor of dialectical materialism fighting against Hegel's absolutism as the paradigm of an anti-realist idealism in the guise of a tranquil wholism of a serene ideal unity. What I already have said above adequately signals my serious reservations as regards these features of Trott's unsympathetic portrait of Hegel.

Moreover, Trott aggressively downplays and minimizes the centrality of negativity to Hegel's philosophy. As a result, one of her endnotes deems "Hegelian" a denial "that contradiction or inconsistency can have real being" (p. 72). But, does not Hegel's entire critique of Kant's theoretical philosophy, with its thing-in-itself, rest upon nothing other than contesting the Kantian assumption of the ontological non-existence of negativity (as contradiction, inconsistency, and the like) as uncritical and indefensible? Put differently, whereas it is Kantian to deny that noumenal "real being" an sich contains contradictions and inconsistencies, it is definitely not Hegelian -- quite the contrary, given Hegel's ontologization of Kant's de-ontologized dialectics.

Before turning to the fourth and final chapter of the book's first part, I feel it appropriate to note what strikes me as an opportunity for a real debate between Hegelian and Badiouian philosophies almost completely missed in the first three chapters. As I previously observed with reference to the "Remark on Idealism" in the Science of Logic, Hegel's absolute idealism involves a realist ontology of thorough-going relationality. However, what is logical (proto)ontology for Hegel is non-ontological phenomenology for Badiou. That is to say, Badiou's 2006 sequel to Being and Event, Logics of Worlds, supplements the mathematical, set-theoretic ontology of his 1988 magnum opus with a logical, category-theoretic phenomenology in which relationality reigns supreme. For Badiou, whereas phenomenal objects-as-appearances are thoroughly relational (as per the logic of category/topos theory), noumenal beings-in-themselves (as the multiplicities of set theory) are wholly discrete qua non-relational. Badiou's mature system displaces the relationality essential to Hegel's anti-finitist absolute idealism from fundamental ontology to phenomenology, a move Hegel would resist. An essay or a book on this authentic and profound difference could stage what likely would be a true and productive collision between Hegelians and Badiouians.

The essay closing Part One is "The Question of Art: Badiou and Hegel" by Gabriel Riera. Riera compares and contrasts, on the one hand, Hegel's philosophy of aesthetics, in which art is seen as the (now historically obsolete) vehicle of truths ultimately belonging to philosophy, and, on the other hand, Badiou's "inaesthetics," in which artists, artworks, and artistic genres autonomously produce properly artistic truths impacting philosophy itself from an extra-philosophical outside. As Riera outlines, this is an instance of Badiou's broader characterization of philosophy as depending upon "events" transpiring within its four more-than-philosophical "conditions" (i.e., art, love, politics, and science) for the truths it contemplates.

Additionally, and by contrast with the disputed Hegelian thesis about the "death of art," Badiou's visions of historical temporalities generally and of artistic events specifically suggest that art has incalculably more in store for philosophy in the unforeseeable future, that philosophy is never finished with art nor vice versa. Despite these just-noted differences between Hegel and Badiou, Riera highlights a thesis held in common between Hegel and Badiou: The activities and products of art express ideas and truths vital for the flourishing and furtherance of philosophy itself.

Part Two opens with Frank Ruda's "Badiou with Hegel: Preliminary Remarks on A(ny) Contemporary Reading of Hegel." Ruda, in his introduction, asks, "what if there is a Hegel that is unknown to Badiou? What if there is a Hegel who can serve as a very useful, maybe even necessary, supplement to Badiou?" (p. 105). These queries set up a Badiouian rendition of the overall arc of Hegelian Logic. To be more precise, Ruda depicts Hegel's Logic as a "faithful truth procedure" as per Badiou, a process of fidelity to a specific starting point initiated via the groundless grounding of an axiomatic decision with respect to "pure Being."

It looks to me as though there is an unresolved tension haunting Ruda's intriguing, suggestive essay. On the one hand, he insists early on in his contribution, "one should never forget that Hegel's Phenomenology was the very precondition for his Science of Logic" (p. 106). On the other hand, Ruda, so as to recast Hegelian Logic along Badiouian lines, presents the beginning of Hegel's Science of Logic in particular as unconditioned/unconditional, namely, as "underivable, undeducible, unanalyzable" (p. 120). Ruda's initial recognition that the Phenomenology is the "ladder" to the Logic sits uneasily side-by-side with his subsequent Badiou-prompted rendition of the start of the Logic as an ex nihilo ab initio.

The next chapter, Norman Madarasz's "The Biolinguistic Challenge to an Intrinsic Ontology," confronts Badiou's anti-naturalist, neo-rationalist theory of subjectivity from a naturalist angle incorporating empirical, life-scientific considerations. Madarasz turns to Noam Chomsky's biolinguistics to supplement Badiou's theory of the subject with a naturalist, bio-materialist philosophy of mind, pleading for a compatibility between the two. Whereas Madarasz's recourse to Chomsky is original in the context of the ongoing reception of Badiou's philosophy, his more fundamental naturalist "challenge" to Badiou is not. For instance, Ray Brassier, Lorenzo Chiesa, Fabio Gironi, Peter Hallward, Slavoj Žižek, and myself already have elaborated at length, on multiple prior occasions, (quasi-)naturalist, biology-informed, and materialist criticisms of Badiouian anti-naturalism. But, Madarasz neither engages with nor even mentions in passing any of us.

Furthermore, Madarasz's essay is riddled with under- and un-explained technical vocabulary. He appears to intend the terms "intrinsic," "immanent," and "innate" to be understood in senses peculiar to an idiosyncratic philosophical parlance that never gets spelled out in his piece. Similarly, given that likely readers will not be conversant with Chomsky's various works, Madarasz's frequent employment-without-defining of specialized Chomskian jargon probably will make his contribution opaque and unappealing to these readers.

In the next chapter, "Badiou and Hegel on Love and the Family," Vernon provides a Hegelian critical assessment of Badiou's account of the amorous. He herein offers a series of insightful, thought-provoking criticisms of how Badiou depicts loving relations. Moreover, Vernon does so partly on the basis of a careful and persuasive reconstruction of Hegel's depiction of the amorous and the familial in 1821's Elements of the Philosophy of Right.

Calcagno furnishes the penultimate chapter with his "Fidelity to the Political Event: Hegel, Badiou, and the Return to the Same." The central thrust of Calcagno's contribution is to problematize what he sees as Badiou's assumption-without-argument that truly political processes can, should, and do repeatedly circumnavigate back to an inaugural founding event that itself remains unchanged over the course of subsequent historical time. Calcagno charges that Badiou fails to posit a conception of trans-temporal identity that he nonetheless cannot avoid presupposing in his theory of political events and fidelities thereto.

I am not convinced that Calcagno articulates a particularly potent criticism of Badiou here. To be blunt, Badiou is well aware of the temporal structures and dynamics Calcagno has in mind and indeed overtly incorporates them into his theory of the event as involving the interrelated components of second events (retroactively eventalizing, so to speak, first events), "forcing," and "naming." Simply put, I believe Calcagno kicks down an open door.

The final chapter is Alberto Toscano's "Taming the Furies: Badiou and Hegel on The Eumenides." Toscano examines the specifically political facets and stakes of Hegel's and Badiou's overlapping references to ancient Greek tragedies. In a broadly Marxist fashion, Toscano gestures towards a simultaneously tragic and dialectical politics in which the tragedy of the divided, dysfunctional polis is the source and site of the political properly speaking. Relatedly, he maintains that both Hegel and Badiou, while bringing to light such a picture of politics, nonetheless simultaneously obscure this same picture through their alleged preoccupations with socio-political reconsolidation, reconstruction, and reconciliation.

For those interested in Badiou and Badiou's relations with Hegel, Badiou and Hegel certainly is worth reading. It contains useful summaries and analyses of the place(s) of Hegel in the Badiouian oeuvre. But, for those interested in Hegel as much as or more than Badiou, it is less than fully satisfactory.

I think a greater balance could have been struck between the "Badiou" and "Hegel" halves of the book. In many of its chapters, there is too much reliance upon what Badiou and the traditions of twentieth-century French/Continental philosophy say about Hegel as self-evidently accurate and true. Yet, many of these representations of Hegel are highly contentious and disputable when not outright caricatures.

Finally, I would suggest an approach to the topic of Badiou avec Hegel taking note of Žižek's version of Lacan avec Hegel. Žižek correctly proposes that Hegel often is most relevant to Lacan's thinking precisely at moments when Lacan does not breathe a word about the German philosopher. Applied to the intersection of Badiouian and Hegelian philosophies, this would counsel looking not only at Badiou's explicit references and responses to Hegel, but scrutinizing moments in Badiou's texts when he does not (seem to) take notice of Hegel but when Hegelian ideas and arguments are quite germane nevertheless. What if Badiou and Hegel had contained a bit more of this sort of approach?