Badiou and Indifferent Being: A Critical Introduction to Being and Event

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William Watkin, Badiou and Indifferent Being: A Critical Introduction to Being and Event, Bloomsbury, 2017, 288pp., $88.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350015661.

Reviewed by Bill Martin, DePaul University


For Alain Badiou, philosophy is axiomatic. Philosophy follows mathematics in this respect. I would propose that the first axiom for the appreciation of Badiou’s philosophy is the recognition that the main philosophical pathways of the twentieth century — analytic, continental, Marxist, Christian, etc. — are exhausted, at least in the sense of being filled out within the parameters these projects have set for themselves. Institutional, academic philosophy certainly seems on the precipice of a very rough ride, to say the least. Conceptually speaking, the problems are of neo-positivism and postmodernism:  on the one hand, more than a hundred years of philosophers telling the world that we really only need philosophy to explain what science is doing (and, guess what? — administrators are now listening and figure this philosophical mediator isn’t worth the money); or, on the other hand, philosophers writing middling-to-bad poetry (in a world that has little use for good poetry) and sociologically tinged texts on how everything is power (“bodies and languages,” as Badiou puts it — except, he says, there are truths, and a truth is always the exception). This bifurcation into two dead-ends, Badiou argues, has been caused by the modern trend whereby philosophy has been “sutured” to its conditions, for example to science in the case of Russell and Quine, or to poetry, in the case of Heidegger and arguably the later Wittgenstein.

If it weren’t for the specific institutions of academic philosophy, all real philosophers would be jumping for joy at the appearance of Badiou’s work. There is nothing less here than the possibility of the renewal of the philosophical project initiated by and since Plato. And we would (indeed, should) be jumping for joy as well for William Watkin’s excellent — if difficult — book, as it gives us the key to what Badiou had called, in Being and Event, Georg Cantor’s fulfillment of Plato’s dream. That is, Watkin demonstrates in great detail why the “return to mathematics,” via set theory, is crucial to the future of philosophy. For, it is only in mathematics that we can have a transmissible, because transparent, guide to the void and infinity and everything in-between — which is to say, reality.

Ontology in this mode — meaning not first of all mathematics, but rather that something beyond ontological relativity is actually possible — was almost an abandoned project for philosophy in the twentieth century. Almost entirely, the exceptions to this were philosophers working on a theological basis, wherein a certain “clarity” is claimed on the basis of something — a revelation, an experience — that exceeds philosophical understanding, and therefore this clarity is not transmissible. Now, in fact, there is something similar here in Badiou’s philosophy, something that depends on what might be called “Platonic Christian” terminology. Watkin gives us the crucial arguments for seeing the difference between Badiou’s philosophy and any kind of monological monotheism.

Indeed, bear in mind, always, what follows the connective in Watkin’s title; the implications of a “Being” that is indifferent are, well, quite different from those of a (the) “Being” that is effectively another way of saying “God.” Another way of saying, or “reaching,” God is through the mathematics of infinity — or so one would think, and here is where we see the difference between what Badiou is doing with mathematics and what is typically called “philosophy of mathematics.” Here let’s jump right into the text where Watkin is discussing Hegel’s term, “bad infinity.” Watkin argues that there are really only three parts of set theory that are needed in Badiou’s philosophy, and these have to do with the void (that is, the empty set), multiples (including multiples of multiples), and a way to “deal with the problem of infinity.”

Clearly the phrase “multiples of multiples” is inconsistent as it proliferates out to an uncountable level with no upper limit, bad infinity as Hegel called it. If infinity in general is immeasurable, bad infinity is immeasurable just because it is too large a number to count. In contrast, good infinity is a transcendentally stable, immeasurable upper seal on the nature of all things, the Being of all beings, a role traditionally occupied by God. Small problem, God doesn’t exist. Solution, what if bad infinity were not so bad after all? What if the uncountable nature of infinity, that it has no single upper limit, were not bad but in fact the best of all possible worlds?

After Cantor, the axiom of actual infinity states that actual infinities exist. You cannot count them, but you can count based on them and you can use the basic rules of this count to prove their stability. Which is another way of saying that just as being is simply a name for that which facilitates the stability of any count, infinity is the name for the fact that every count is provably stable, irrespective of how many elements you may add. The truth is that all situations are uncountable as an overall, closed and consistent One, without the imposition of an inexistent God, but this does not mean that they are not consistent per se in other, formal, transmissible procedural and secular ways. If instead of an existent God you spoke of inexistent Being as void, you can absolutely prove the overall stability of any situation whatsoever by simply saying it is an actual infinity. (p.18)

Apart from the “small problem,” which I think is a charming way to state the point, I cite this passage because it demonstrates well the richness of what very quickly arises in Badiou’s austere framework.

For instance, consider the insertion of the term “secular” into this description of actual, mathematical infinity; in a simple move — one that Badiou also calls “banal” — the weight of Sartre’s “inexistent God,” by whom we are abandoned, is lifted. There is indeed a sense in which mathematical infinity, as axiom, as the uncountable, is banal — it is also extraordinary and majestic; and though Badiou assigns philosophy what Watkin calls an “ambassadorial role” in relation to mathematics (p.2), this role also returns to philosophy some of the majesty that it has lost in recent decades. More on this in a moment. In taking account of God’s inexistence (the “small problem,” I can’t help but chuckle) scholars have pointed out certain affinities between Sartre and Buddhism. There are affinities, for sure, but in Sartre there often seems to be a hovering sense of anger and confusion at God’s failure to exist. In Buddhism and Badiou, instead, there is equanimity toward the measures of this inexistence — impermanence, contingency, the lack of any One that holds “it all” together and gives “it all” meaning. There is no “it all,” there are only multiplicities of multiplicities, infinite infinities, overwhelmingly indifferent to what we think or do not think about them. In Buddhism, the void is nothing to fear or theologize, either (even in the sense of negative theology), and of course the void (or emptiness) has been developed over many centuries as a sophisticated philosopheme. Even so, and I think this is Badiou’s signal contribution, it takes mathematics to establish an ontology not bound by the One — because God (under whatever name, for instance “Logos”) always has a way of sneaking back in.

Dealing with these cunning “impositions,” to borrow Watkin’s term, could be called the work of deconstruction. And yet Derrida saw this work as interminable. There is always the temptation of the One, just as, in Sartre’s later work, there is the pull of the practico-inert (or, to use a related term, reification). To be clear, Badiou’s argument is not that returning to Plato and mathematics, with the help of Cantor, Zermelo, Fraenkel, Cohen, etc., leads us to the “final revolution,” in philosophy or any of its “conditions” (as Badiou calls them — science, art, politics, and love). Badiou is certainly a “Maoist” here — “one divides into two,” synthesis, the emergence of the new is not “two combines into one.” What mathematics does, in exploring the void and actual infinity (the infinite infinities of infinities, which absolutely escapes the definite article) and the endless multiplicities that make up our situations (what Badiou more recently calls our “worlds”), is to give us a North Star. Because there is such a star, what Badiou calls the “Stellar Matheme,” there is no “reason” why there will not always be a chance for creative human endeavor.

Philosophy’s role in all this is three-fold. First, it is declarative — philosophy declares that mathematics is the key to ontology. One might say that it is the very indifference of mathematics that earns it this special place. Second, philosophy “takes to heart,” so to speak, the axioms that mathematicians are compelled to accept in running up against the limitations of the previous axioms. There will always be more to this work, there is no end to it any more than there is an end to numbers. And yet there are decisive moments, which might be called the "creative work of discovery, which leads to the third role of philosophy. It is philosophy’s job to declare when a moment has come that “breaks the (existing) world into two” (to use an expression from Nietzsche that Badiou likes), that creates a “before and after” structure, and it is philosophy’s job to map the formal structure of such an “event.”

Cantor thought he could use the set-theoretical definition of (what he called) “absolute infinity” to prove the existence of God. Gödel also thought he could prove God’s existence with mathematical logic. In my view, Badiou does not give Gödel enough credit, and not because of the “simple problem.” Watkin helps a great deal on this point, though I have to admit I’m a bit out of my depth here — but, as on many points, there is so much to explore in terms of the mechanics of what Badiou is doing with set theory (see, for instance, pp.88-90, where Watkin takes up Gödel’s first incompleteness theorem). Significantly, Gödel avowed himself a Platonist, and he extended Einstein’s field equations to demonstrate the non-existence of time, a position very congenial to Badiou.

This is not a book about theology, and neither, more significantly, is it a book about politics. On the latter point, as someone who first of all turned to Badiou out of political motivations, I think all similarly motivated Badioueans ought to be grateful for Watkin’s efforts. For the Stellar Matheme shines a light on the importance of actual philosophical work, instead of continuing with the idea that truth is first of all a political matter and then confusing philosophy with politics and vice-versa. This Stellar Matheme then lights the way toward conceiving politics not as the “art of the possible” within the existing parameters of things (all we need for that is power, appetite, and money, the three poisons about which Plato continually warns), but instead first of all as that which “unbinds,” that which breaks consensus. “Political philosophers” need to stop talking so large about what they know on the basis of exhausted paradigms. (The term “political philosophers” is placed in scare-quotes because, again, Badiou warns against the “suturing” of philosophy to its conditions.) We live in a time when “Everything we know stands against us” — and this goes to Badiou’s argument against epistemology, and for formalist, mathematical ontology.

Here, then, part of what I very much appreciate about Watkin’s book is that I am indeed out of my depth on many of Badiou’s mathematically-based arguments, and I feel sure that the only way that not only I, but a good many of us are going to get anywhere with these arguments is through the resource of this book.

This is also not a book about materialism and idealism, which might be considered strange in that it is a book about ontology and about a philosophy that requires, perhaps as its first axiom, recognition that numbers are real. “Platonic” or mathematical “materialism” would seem to be a non-starter, but perhaps just as Andrew Wiles was able to listen in on the vastly-complex conversations of seemingly unrelated clouds of numbers in order to finally prove Fermat’s Last Theorem, we see that (the?) true matter of things is indeed revealed in a purely formal sense, as the infinite and indifferent conversations of numbers. Significantly, Badiou cites Wiles’s fantastical proof in his “Preamble” to The Communist Hypothesis, titled, “What is Called Failure.”

Regarding matter and materiality (which Watkin does indeed discuss, see esp. pp.67-68, and pp.207-209), Watkin might have cited Euclid’s proof from 2300 years ago that there is no highest prime number. This means that, after the heat-death of the universe, there will still be another, prime number higher than any discovered by a mathematically-conscious mind — this number will be “out there,” indifferent to discovering minds, a purely external reality. This is the Stellar Matheme beyond, qualitatively and absolutely beyond, actual, material stars. One thinks of the famous lines from the Heart Sutra: “emptiness is form, form is also emptiness.” These stellar mathemes float eternally in the space between the void and infinity. What sense would it make to say that these numbers are not “out there” if there are no minds to discover them, or that these numbers only exist because minds “invent” them?

That, however, is another discussion, and I’m also glad that Watkin did not complicate matters even further by getting into the materialism/idealism debate — instead, as I said, his book demonstrates mathematical materialism by showing what numbers are always already doing. It is on this point that I want to conclude, by returning to the question of axioms. This is where it is not so hard to take a theological turn, and also a subjectivist turn, both of which Badiou does everything to resist. Here I wonder if Watkin does not give away — inadvertently, I’m sure — a bit too much. In his otherwise excellent explanations of retroactive axiomatic reasoning (pp.16-19) and the communicability of mathematical ideas (pp.19-20), Watkin already makes what I would call a “concession” to “community standards.” Though he invokes Kant and Foucault on this point, there seems to be a bit too much Rorty here — which is fine in itself, except that Badiou would have no part of this.

The process by which a new axiom is accepted in mathematics must come, at least initially and primarily, from a seeming impossibility in mathematics. With the introduction of the new axiom, it is seen by mathematicians (subjects of mathematical truths) that the supposed impossibility is indeed possible, but, for numbers themselves, nothing is impossible. And, numbers themselves are completely indifferent to what anyone thinks of them, axiomatically or otherwise. This is a line that cannot be crossed in Badiou’s philosophy, but it is very tempting to cross it. When it comes, then, to the difficult question of “forcing,” on which (again) Watkin supplies an excellent chapter (pp.221-251 — this happens to be the closing chapter of the book), the opening to subjectivity returns to haunt the analysis.

This is my only quibble with an otherwise superb and indispensable book, which provides the best map we are likely to have of Badiou’s mathematical-ontological project. Additionally, Watkin sets the stage for where Badiou goes next, in Logics of Worlds, where we are brought down from the commanding heights of eternal mathematics, into the more or less intense logic of our fleeting material world. Watkin has promised a book exploring this world, too, under the title Communicable Worlds, which I eagerly anticipate.