Badiou and Philosophy

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Sean Bowden and Simon Duffy (eds.), Badiou and Philosophy, Edinburgh University Press, 2012, 256pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748643523.

Reviewed by Frank Ruda, Freie Universität, Berlin


There are many jokes about psychoanalysis. One, which was not even supposed to be one, was brought up by Freud himself: A patient tells his dream in analysis and after narrating it, he says, whoever the person in his dream is, it is certainly not my mother. And, as this by now proverbial saying continues, it is certainly his mother. Another one: How to diagnose a patient coming to psychoanalysis? It is quite easy, if he comes too late to his first session he is a hysteric, if he comes (a bit) too early he is a paranoid, and if he comes on time he is an obsessional neurotic. Both jokes play with the idea that one cannot escape psychoanalysis, once being in touch with it. But, although this might sound strange, it is actually not completely true. One needs to supplement the jokes with another insight linked to psychoanalysis, namely that one cannot but resist it. The catch does not lie in the fact that you either agree with its uncomforting ideas or you simply resist and thereby -- against your will -- confirm its theory. The idea is rather that even affirming all insights of psychoanalysis (when for example taking an analysis) can be (and often is) a way of resisting what psychoanalysis seeks to bring to the fore. This is why, as already Freud and after him Lacan claimed, one of the most crucial functions of psychoanalysis is to deal with resistances. This is why psychoanalysis is one of the first theories about (forms and functioning of) resistances against theory. Resistance to it is in some sense unavoidable, i.e., necessary, although to completely withdraw from its realm is, properly speaking, not possible either. Resistance is necessary and impossible and it is thus absolutely relevant to understand precisely how (practical or theoretical) resistance is articulated.

Today with all the developments in -- at least -- the European academic context, it might be said that (at least continental) philosophy and theory in general is facing a lot of resistance. It seems that the insight of psychoanalysis remains valid. The wide-spread endorsement of Hegel in pragmatist schools seems to follow precisely the model mentioned above: many attempts to actualize some sort of decapitated Hegel (one without absolute knowing) is one way of resisting the traumatic kernel of his thought. However, what today might be claimed vis-à-vis Hegel can hardly be upheld with regard to Plato. There are very few committed Platonists around, and the whole last century has been dominated (in philosophy) by many attempts to finally get rid of Plato once and for all. This is the common trait of Nietzsche, Foucault, Deleuze, the analytic school, etc. For quite some time there has been only one self-proclaimed Platonist: Alain Badiou. But what to do if one is alone? Badiou once stated that he stuck to a statement by Zhou En-Lai from the tenth congress of the Chinese Communist party: "You can accept being alone if your line is just, one day you will be an army." Today, the situation might seem different. Badiou is widely read, discussed, praised or at least criticized. He has made it into newspapers and onto televisions screens; conferences and academic volumes are devoted to his work. There even seem to be some Badiouians working in some of the academic niches still left over for people interested in so called continental philosophy. Following Zhou En-Lai's dictum might have proven to be the right way to go. Did the previously isolated thinker thus become an army?

The temptation is to simply answer "yes" and take another volume devoted to his thought, namely "Badiou and Philosophy", to be representative of this very fact. Badiou instigated some far-reaching discussions that paradigmatically manifest themselves in this collection of articles, which treat Badiou's relation to mathematics, to general philosophical notions and orientations (the subject, materialism, time, practice) and ultimately to other philosophers (Lacan, Sartre, Heidegger and Deleuze). The reader versed a bit in Badiou's thought might first find this structuring a bit surprising since he distinguishes not only between philosophy and other forms of practices, but he also enumerates four types of practices to be of utmost importance for philosophy, because they are able to produce truths: art, politics, love and science. Only three are apparent in this collection (the political subject is the topic of Nina Power's paper; love is treated in the article on Badiou and Lacan by Justin Clemens and Adam Bartlett; and the whole first section deals with Badiou and science). Nothing is included on the notoriously under-represented relation of Badiou's philosophy to art.

However, is it correct to claim that one finds here something like a report of an (imaginary) meeting of (one squadron of) the Badiouian army? What if the soldiers are arguing about the battle lines? In terms of this fiction, one of the things that comes to mind after reading the volume is Molière's expression, "Il y a fagots et fagots." Shouldn't this also hold for potential (imaginary) armies? There are armies and armies. This army seems to include some rebellious tendencies, maybe even deserters. This is to say that the volume includes some harsh criticisms of the army's symbolic leader. And why should the soldiers not be critical if the leader does not propose the right strategy for the upcoming battle? I think something else is at stake here. But first, we need a depiction of the multiple charges that spring from the symbolic rebellion of the army-members against the leader. All these charges seem to subvert the volume's claim to present "a balanced assessment of the ways in which Badiou responds to various philosophical thinkers, arguments and traditions". (1) But this might also be taken as a proof that any balance relies on some unbalance at its foundation.

So, a brief overview of some of the reasons for desertion: Sean Bowden criticizes Badiou for not having a single and unified conception of being and thereby forgetting that his Platonic ontology needs to presuppose a dialectic that he cannot account for.  Bowden prefers an ontology in which being is articulated in a single sense applying to all, so that differences between ontologies do not appear as conflicting subjective ontological commitments (55-56). Anindya Bhattacharyya criticizes Badiou for his attachment to a too static ontology (that of set theory), whereas a radicalization of the commitment to mathematics via category theory would even overcome what she frames as Badiou's pessimism (95): the view that the idea of a political revolution -- this is taken to follow from his theory of the state -- expresses merely a romantic idealism. James Williams attacks Badiou for denying the durational nature of time, due to his insistence on a Platonism of eternal truths that, according to Williams, emerge from the outset of the concrete worlds. Badiou is thus mistaken by the very framing of his Platonic ontology (which turns out to be a political ontology) and is said to end up defending political violence (125-130). Talia Morag attacks Badiou for a too abstract and indefensible attachment to metaphysical claims that make his whole ontology into a gigantic set of verbal tricks (134) against which a pragmatist version of Badiou, or rather a shift from Badiou to Quine, could account for what Badiou is unable to account for: the richness of the empirical world. Jon Roffe reconstructs Badiou's criticism of Deleuze only to prove that this critique should be applied less to Deleuze than to Badiou himself, who thereby becomes the ultimate philosopher of the one.

But one can also find some brave soldiers who agree with the party- and battle-line. Tzuchien Tho elaborates the historical coordinates of the relation between Badiou's thought and Cantor's set theoretical innovation. Brian A. Smith shows how Badiou's position evolves and seeks to overcome limitations linked to the question of stabilizing political organization in the philosophy of Sartre, who was one of his teachers. Graham Harman traces Heidegger's role in Badiou's Theory of the Subject and credits Badiou for being one of the few profound and against-the-grain-readers of Heidegger. Ed Pluth highlights the complex arguments and intricacies that stand behind Badiou's conception of materialism, also mainly focusing on his Theory of the Subject. Justin Clemens and Adam Bartlett demonstrate the depth of Badiou's debt to Lacan, proving how for Badiou any contemporary philosophical position somehow has to pass through psychoanalytic anti-philosophy and thus why any such position necessarily has to deal with the impossible points of resistance.

This volume thus does not simply manifest the logic of the psychoanalytic conceptual myth according to which the children (sons) need to kill the (real-symbolic) father to take over his symbolic position (with the implied monopoly of enjoyment, mastery, etc.). They thereby finally become adults--after the father returns in a different guise and imposes his law, which will haunt but also protect them forever. (Something like this was, as the reader may know, the case with Badiou's former pupil Medhi Belhaj Kacem and his 2011 Après Badiou.) We are without any doubt witnesses of a different battle when reading this volume -- not a battle between fathers and sons, but just maybe between one squadron of the army and another. To clarify what I see as a trait common to nearly all the imaginary deserters, I am tempted to repeat here a variation of the proverbial joke I mentioned at the beginning. A reader of Badiou articulates his or her criticism of his position but immediately claims that whatever you are going to say about its validity, it is not about Plato. And of course, one might anticipate what Freud might have said to this. I take this proverb to be appropriate here, since in one way or the other, what links all the critical pieces in this collection together is their more or less latent, more or less implicit (neo-)Aristotelianism.

Let me give a much too abbreviated proof of this. Badiou always insists that ontology, which for him is set theory, does not provide any definition of what a set is, yet he claims that set theory offers the most formal presentation of being. Bowden wishes to replace this ontology without a concept (of being) with an ontology with a unified concept (of the one being) that could render struggles between conflicting ontological claims intelligible as a form of (dialectic of) differentiation of (the one) being. Thus he prefers being as dynamic (auto-)differentiation to being (without concept) as static: he therefore sides with Aristotle (being as movement) against Plato (being as stasis). Bhattacharyya wants to uphold Badiou's commitment to mathematics but seeks to do away with Badiou's reference to classical set theory that "serves as a conservative break on thought today" (96) and argues for fully embracing category theory. The motivation behind this argument is that while set theory (ontology) renders being static and treats relations as secondary, mathematical category theory (which Badiou himself employs in his phenomenology, as able to render the logic of appearance) takes relationality to be the first and paramount category. For Bhattacharyya a theory that gives primacy to relation therefore also puts forth a more optimistic and viable consideration of a politics of revolution.

Her problematizing (and to my mind highly problematic) reading of Badiou's political position (completely ignoring his conception of the "communist hypothesis") thereby seems to be systematically motivated by an attempt to spirit away the systematic kernel of any true Platonism: the distinction between being and appearances, the definition of being as static and finally the very idea of the idea (which is constitutive for both). (Although Badiou also claims that ontology is what he calls a "world" and thus follows a logic of appearance, this should not be confused with claiming that everything is deducible from the logic of phenomena, i.e., phenomenology tout court.)To begin with relation and to omit the logical distinction of ontology and phenomenology (in mathematical or other terms) implies taking one thing for granted: relationality. This ultimately leads to a fundamentally Aristotelian predicament, namely that there is nothing outside of relations. And if there is nothing outside of relations, there can be no exception to them and thus any (political or other) change can only be accounted for in terms of an actualization of a given potential (that is inscribed into this concept of relationality). This is, again, Aristotle against Plato. Morag is very much in line with this argument since she wants to do "without ontology" and openly embraces a sort of pragmatism (which also could be said to be an outcome of Bhattacharyya's position). Both positions also could very much support the secularized Aristotelian (and typically pragmatist) claim that "nothing is eternal, except the passing of things in time", which is to say that there are no exceptions to the only true notion of change: temporal mobilism. It also follows that the very idea of truths emerging from exceptions (and therefore the idea of an idea) has to be given up.

There is much to be learned from the critical and passionate engagements with Badiou's thought that are gathered in this collection, yet I cannot help but think of the following variation on another proverbial joke: with an army like this, who needs enemies? Kant claimed that philosophy is a battlefield, and one might take this volume to prove not only this but also the ability of Badiou's thought to actualize very old lines of demarcation on this very battlefield and make them contemporary for us (Plato against Aristotle). But for anyone interested in Badiou's philosophy, the true strength of this collection lies in the Platonic antidote to the variety of Badiou-inspired Aristotelianism that is provided in those articles penned by the faithful Badiouian soldiers. The arguments and reconstructions they provide make reading this imaginary army report highly instructive and even necessary. This volume shows-- maybe against its own will -- that there is still a struggle about and in philosophy, and it thereby demonstrates that Badiou's impact on philosophical thought lies -- amongst other things -- in having revivified philosophy as a battlefield. Against the contemporary doxa that all opinions and positions should be considered as being of equal validity, this volume in Badiouian spirit proves that today one still cannot elude taking up a position in one army or the other. For the  philosophical battle cry par excellence continues to be: either Plato or Aristotle!