Badiou and Plato: An Education by Truths

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A. J. Bartlett, Badiou and Plato: An Education by Truths, Edinburgh University Press, 2011, 248pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780748643752.

Reviewed by Russell Grigg, Deakin University


This book is something of a tour de force. A. J. Bartlett has crafted an elegant and subtle analysis of the meaning of Socrates and Plato -- or "Platocrates" as he calls the subject of the dialogues -- by drawing on the philosophical program of Alain Badiou. The result is an original and compelling study of Plato, one that breaks with some of the standard readings of the dialogues -- the discussion of Gregory Vlastos in chapter 5 is particularly compelling in this respect -- and the analysis goes well beyond a compare and contrast exercise, delivering as it does genuine insights into the dialogues. In fact the juxtaposition of Badiou with Plato is not at all unmotivated. Badiou has famously described his philosophy as Platonism of the multiple, and he regards Being and Event as the major work in which this project, which is less a return to than a continuation of Plato's project, is realised.[1] One should also note Badiou's "hypertranslation" of the Republic into French, now available in English.[2]

There is a second dimension to this book that is equally valuable. I am perhaps not alone in having wanted to see how the rather abstract categories of Badiou's Being and Event actually cash out in specific terms. Those who have felt the need to see some illustration of the system, to see how it works, in a given concrete situation, should study this book. Chapter by chapter, Bartlett lays out the elements of Badiou's system, elaborates them and then applies them, with precision, to particular aspects of Plato's philosophy in a manner that then illuminates the system of Being and Event.

Central to Bartlett's study of Plato is what it means for Socrates to be the advocate and champion of the fundamental importance of an "education by truths". This commitment on Socrates' part places him in opposition not just to the sophists -- that much goes without saying -- but to the social order itself. Actually, "opposition" is not really the right word, since, on Bartlett's account, the exclusion of Socrates turns out to be more radical than this, to the point where Socrates can only be the name for something that is invisible to the state, we might even say foreclosed from it, by the simple fact of his insistence upon the search for education by truths over the learning or knowledge of the sophists.

In arguing for the Platonist thesis that proper teaching is an education by truths, which he takes to mean not only the rejection of a philosophical discourse based on learning, Bartlett is also led to the more controversial thesis that there must be a reference to a language outside of philosophy, namely mathematics, as foundational for philosophy itself.

Each of the chapters takes up an issue in Plato's work, which is discussed via key concepts in Badiou, and these concepts provide the six chapter titles: State, Site, Event/Intervention, Fidelity, Subject and Generic. The result is that we get a detailed explication of key issues in Badiou, at the same time as a reinvigorated interpretation of Plato's philosophical intentions. The chapter headings suggest that the discussion of Plato serves as a springboard for an exposition of Badiou's philosophy, but this is only partly true, since the discussion in each chapter involves a delicate interweaving of Platonist and Badiouian themes that, like Russell's turtles, goes all the way down.

The introduction, "Trajectory", makes two general claims that set the scene: first, that any teaching that produces thinking, in its true sense, is antithetical to the so-called educational activities of the state. This is as true today, it is claimed, as it was in Plato's day, and this is one sense in which Badiou's philosophy is a form of what he calls "contemporary Platonism". The second general claim is that inserting Badiou's concepts into Plato's work is to return them to where they came from, and that this confirms the immanence of Badiou's work to Plato's philosophy.

Chapter 1, "State", which begins with the Apology, argues for the claim that not just some citizens of the state are sophists but that the state is itself a "sophist" insofar as it cannot admit the existence of what it does not know, or even that it cannot know. This is effectively what makes Socrates a foreigner, and indeed an absolute foreigner, more dangerous because he also belongs to the city. That Socrates is cast outside the state by virtue of his ignorance is elaborated in terms of Badiou's thought on a historical situation in general, and on the structure of this particular historical situation, the Athens of Socrates. The chapter includes a fairly technical discussion of types of situations (natural, neutral and historical). Athens is described as a historical situation by virtue of the fact that it contains an "anomaly" (Socrates) that cannot be represented in or by the state, for which knowledge always takes the form of semblants.

In Chapter 2, "Site", Bartlett unpacks Badiou further. A "site", or an "evental site", is a locus in any situation that is a kind of bridge, maybe a point of instability, that is an element of a given situation and also the mark of a point at which the consistency of the situation is exposed to being ruptured. A site is foreclosed from being represented by or within a situation. In Plato's work, the site is called education. The structural nature of this analysis is then used in support of the view that the reason Socrates, this singular feature of Athenian society, is on trial is so as to protect the state from the void that his presence exposes the state to. Socrates' insistence on truth opens up this void in the state, as it were, which responds by his condemnation. In Socrates' own terms, this insistence on truth makes him merely a vehicle of something that will perdure beyond his demise.

Chapter 3, "Event/Intervention", starts with an exposition of these two key concepts in Being and Event. Bartlett is interested in the "eventuality" of an event, that is, with what makes an event, which may be a mere random, contingent occurrence, something that opens up the possibility of change. An event does not bring change by itself. For change to occur, for the "eventuality" of an event, something more, which Badiou calls an "intervention", must take place. Again, Bartlett provides a detailed analysis of the necessary features, or categories, of any intervention. He then proceeds to give an analysis of the Socrates event and the intervention made by Plato with reference to the allegory of the cave, where Bartlett remarks upon the chance encounter, or the "necessary contingency" of the event that triggers the action of an individual or a people.

No chance encounter can develop on its own into a turning point, called an "event" in Badiou's terminology; something extra is required. Thus, in chapter 4, Bartlett provides a detailed analysis of what pertains to the requisite "fidelity" to an event in order for this transformation to occur. He then addresses the role Plato plays in relation to what we might call the Socrates-event and, in an interesting analysis, considers the Platonic corpus as a retrial of Socrates, whose outcome is not to exonerate him. On the contrary, for Bartlett, Plato is inclined to agree that Socrates is guilty of corruption, but that what he is guilty of corrupting is itself a corrupt state. Two claims emerge from this: that the sophistry is the sophistry of the state, and not of this or that citizen, and that Plato's fidelity, situated above and beyond the death of Socrates himself, is to the "infinitude" of Socrates' address, that is, to an infinite discourse of truths that stands opposed to the discourse of the state.

Chapter 5 is dedicated to a critique of the influential interpretation of the dialogues by Vlastos. While the criticism of this influential reading of Plato is rather devastatingly effective, the point of it is to argue for the more positive claim that the mathematical turn in Plato's philosophy is not a turn away from Socrates but is rather in continuity with it and therefore indicative of the "fidelity" of Plato to the Socrates-event. This chapter contains the briefest discussion of Badiou of all the chapters. It has the longest treatment of Plato, albeit indirectly, via a discussion of one of the most influential recent interpreters of the dialogues. It stands a little apart from the remainder of the book for this reason.

The final chapter brings the book to a close with a discussion of the "generic" as it appears at the end of Being and Event. This is a difficult discussion of what is in itself quite difficult and complex material in Badiou's work. Nevertheless, Bartlett manages to set out in clear and logical terms the "analytic of the generic", to use Badiou's expression.

Bartlett's return to Plato through the lens of Badiou's Being and Event yields an interesting and refreshing re-examination of the dialogues. The book is valuable for this alone. It is also a rigorous account of the key categories and concepts of Badiou's magnum opus and, while not a primer on Badiou by any means, Bartlett achieves a remarkably succinct account of the complex and difficult philosophy of this important, contemporary thinker.

[1] Being and Event, trans by Oliver Feltham, Polity, 2013.

[2] La République de Platon, Fayard, 2012; Plato’s Republic: A Dialogue in 16 Chapters, trans. by Susan Spitzer, intro. by Kenneth Reinhard, Columbia University Press, 2013.