Badiou and the German Tradition of Philosophy

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Jan Völker (ed.), Badiou and the German Tradition of Philosophy, Bloomsbury, 2019, 220pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350069954.

Reviewed by Paul M. Livingston, University of New Mexico


The eleven new essays in this book describe and assess the complex relationships between Alain Badiou's philosophical project and those of five German philosophers: Kant, Hegel, Marx, Heidegger, and Adorno. These discussions illuminate interesting points of connection and identify suggestive parallels and anticipations -- often at a considerable distance from Badiou's own official, more explicitly critical positions on these figures -- thereby giving new resonance to Badiou's own call for a contemporary renewal of rationalist philosophy, against prevalent forms of sophistry, historicism, empiricism, constructivism, and postmodernism. Readers with an interest in any of the specific historical figures discussed, as well as those who follow Badiou's own bold theoretical project of formally and rationally articulating the possibility of situational and collective transformation on the basis of a renewed appeal to the universal, will find much here. Equally, the essays succeed in eliciting a number of problems that appear relevant and useful for contemporary meta-philosophical reflection to take up. These include questions about such interrelated topics as the nature of metaphysical and logical unity, the structure and possibility of philosophy's theoretical or critical claims with respect to totality, identity, and finitude, and the possible continuation or transformation of philosophical dialectics in our time.

After Jan Völker's useful introduction, the volume opens with an autobiographical reflection by Badiou himself on the role of several German philosophers in the gradual development of the project of a "materialist dialectic" that he announced in his 2006 Logics of Worlds. Interestingly, and pointing to a connection that has been little explored by his interpreters, Badiou here describes Husserl's phenomenological theory of intentionality as exerting, through Sartre, a decisive early influence on his own thinking about the possibility of a philosophical consideration of being. This is because, for the young Badiou, Husserl's idea of intentionality posited "an immediate relationship" of thinking to being, itself understood in ontologically realist terms. As Badiou understands it, this intentional relationship of thinking and being is, additionally, not simply one of passive reception but indeed the "active operation" of thinking in relation to the "pure indifference" (p. 11) of being in itself. It was, he says here, in the paradoxical relationship of thinking to this indifference that he already identified the place of the "possible construction of a world," (p. 11) or (as he would formulate it some years later in Being and Event) the possibly transformative intervention of a "subject" within a determinate sociopolitical, artistic, scientific, or amorous situation to produce structurally fundamental change.

If thinking is thus seen as related to being in the form of a constitutive and potentially productive engagement with the latter's pure and indifferent structure, it becomes possible, as many of the volume's subsequent essays bear out, to see various positions in Kantian and post-Kantian philosophy retrospectively as providing variant and comparable formulations of this relationship. Thus, for example, Rado Riha's "Badiou, Kant and the Question of the Subject" considers the implications of Kant's idea of the subject as structuring the phenomenal realm only by way of its constitutive exclusion of an unknowable thing-in-itself. Through this constitutive exclusion, the pure, anonymous being of the noumenal amounts in Kant's philosophy, Riha argues, to a kind of "present absence" that is necessarily separated from the empirical world, but nevertheless capable of organizing its self-consistency as a whole (p. 21). However, because this structuring consistency is also identified with the transcendental unity conferred by the transcendental subject, Kant's first Critique already poses the significant problem of the possible placement of this "trans-empirical" subject within the empirical field it structures as a whole. On Riha's reading, although Kant does not ultimately resolve this problem, he moves through the development of his critical system toward formulating it more explicitly. In the Critique of Judgment, in particular, the paradoxical structure of subjective judgment is figured in the power of a "reflecting" (or "reflective") judgment founded in the subject's responsiveness to a singular particular, but nevertheless capable of attaining the justified universality of conceptual thought. As Riha notes, this resembles somewhat Badiou's conception of the evental subject as a kind of "inner exception" (p. 33) necessarily positioned within a particular situation, but nevertheless capable of attaining a trans-situational "generic" universality through a determined response to what is retrospectively evident there as one of its singular cases.

The next three essays focus on Badiou's relationship to Hegel. Here, the question of the possibility and structure of dialectics, especially in relation to the two philosophers' apparently sharply contrasting claims about the being and nature of totality, emerges as a particular site of engagement as well as tension. As Dominik Finkelde notes early in "Lack and Concept: On Hegelian Motives in Badiou," there is here an immediately evident and deeply marked contrast between the two philosophers' starting points. Whereas Badiou's mature philosophical project essentially begins by denying the existence of the Whole, in the sense of an all-encompassing and self-consistent totality of entities, Hegel's own global assertion of the identity of thinking and being effectively guarantees the possibility and progression of dialectics only by repeatedly invoking essential figures of such a comprehensive and thinkable totality. This central difference does not, however, preclude Badiou from appealing at various stages of his project equally centrally to the methodology of dialectical thinking. For instance, when he begins his early Theory of the Subject by reading in structuralist terms the opening dialectic of Hegel's Science of Logic, between the abstract identity of an object and its structural "placement" or appearance within a world, Badiou's aim is not so much to refute Hegel's thinking of the absolute character of the law of identity ("A=A") as to follow him (on this reading) in finding an essential aspect of non-identity hidden within it. This confirms, according to Finkelde, that both Hegel and Badiou can be seen as arguing that the consistency of an object's identity is "always dependent on" an underlying "inconsistency;" or -- switching metaphors -- that the unity of any structured situation depends upon the dissimulation of a more basic lack of consistency. This inconsistency, Finkelde suggests, can also be thought of as a kind of inherent but "unrepresentable" excess essential to the positive structure of any constituted identity (p. 49). It is this inconsistent excess, identified by Hegel with the negativity of the subject, that can then also become the basis for the possibility of structural novelty through the "retotalization" (p. 50) of an existing situation as a transformed, post-evental new whole.

Somewhat similarly, Frank Ruda reads Hegel's Phenomenology as proposing, in the concluding figure of "absolute knowing," the progress of knowledge, not to a point of absolute and self-consistent completion, but rather to the point of thinking's recognition of being's essential incompleteness. At this point, Ruda argues, "we experience that our knowledge is constitutively incomplete, not because we do not know enough, but because the world and universe is constitutively incomplete" (p. 56); and here in this paradoxical knowledge of essential incompleteness, we also see the essential possibility for new and transformative knowledge to appear.

In "The Torsion of Idealism," Völker helpfully rehearses the terms in which Badiou theorizes the problematic relations of unity, multiplicity, and presentation to argue for the inaugural decision of his project, namely the decision that "the one is not." If being is identified with unity, Badiou here tersely argues, then it must be the case that what is multiple is not. However, although presentations are unitary, what is presented appears multiple. If, then, we are to affirm the reality of presentation -- from which alone we have any "access to being" -- then it follows that the identification of being and unity must be broken: being is not to be identified with unity, and presentation is either paradoxical in itself or (Badiou's own conclusion) it is the result of a secondary operation. He calls this operation the "count-as-one," and sees it as imposing the consistent unity of presentation upon what is otherwise only "pure, inconsistent multiplicity." This necessary secondariness of the thinking of unity leads Badiou, Völker argues, to theorize a specific and unavoidable "torsion" of the philosophical consideration of the thinking-being relationship, or of any possible presentation of being in itself. In particular, because of the necessity of the operation of "counting-as-one" which alone makes being accessible to thought, we can indeed think being in itself, but only in a secondary way that constitutively acknowledges the situatedness and placement, within being, of this very thought.

The next two essays concern, respectively, Marx and Heidegger. Svenja Bromberg considers the somewhat uncertain place apparently occupied by Marx relative to one of Badiou's major terms of theoretical categorization, that of the so-called "anti-philosopher." One of the characteristic aims of "anti-philosophy" as Badiou theorizes it is that of making a final end of philosophy by means of the production of a non-theoretical "radical act" of practice in any of the extra-philosophical domains of politics, art, science, or love. Marx's materialist inversion of Hegel's idealism and his more general rejection of theoretical philosophy in favor of practical engagement may seem to involve just such an invocation in the register of the political. But on Bromberg's reading, Marx's work is rather to be understood as indicating an acknowledgment, much closer to Badiou's own commitments, of the necessary conditioning of philosophical thinking by extra-philosophical (for example political or artistic) situations and events.

In "The Question Concerning Technology: Badiou versus Heidegger," Justin Clemens argues that, despite Badou's own occasional disavowals, "Heidegger is in fact the most crucial of philosophers for Badiou," albeit primarily in the mode of "polarization" (p. 116, italics in original). In particular, as Badiou says in a 2014 interview, the project of Being and Event is centrally determined by his rejection of the "poetical . . . ontology" he associates with Heidegger, on which (as Badiou puts it in Being and Event) being is figured as "endowment and gift, as presence and opening," within the characteristic Heideggerian doctrine of truth as unconcealment. For this, Badiou substitutes the central meta-ontological claim of Being and Event, that ontology is (simply) mathematics, as captured in the ZF axioms of set theory, along with their extended formal consequences. Far from representing, as Heidegger thinks, the essential formal precondition for the "enframing" processes of modern technology and calculation, mathematics is thus for Badiou rather the formalization of the very possibility of a rational understanding of being, insofar as it is presentable at all. As Clemens argues, however, this identification of being (insofar as it is consistently presentable) with mathematical formalism does not amount to a mere reduction of truth to calculation or formal operations. Rather, quite to the contrary, it allows Badiou to formulate the unstable and potentially radically transformative relationship between truth and being, especially under the heading of the "generic" which Badiou extracts from P. J. Cohen's rigorous completion of the proof of the undecidability of the continuum hypothesis relative to the ZF axioms.

The last four essays turn to Adorno, again taking up the question of the possibility and form of a philosophical dialectics, in relation to such questions as those of the possibility of freedom, the basis of transformative action and praxis, and the relationship between philosophy and art. Christoph Menke's insightful essay usefully poses the question of dialectics at issue between Badiou, Adorno, and Hegel, as one of the position of subjective thought and action in relation to the essential functions of negation, affirmation, identity, and totality. Whereas Hegel's dialectic essentially sees the freedom of the subject as a matter of its self-realization through an iterated "negation of the negation," Adorno insists under the heading of "negative dialectics" on an essential and non-circumscribable non-identity between subject and object. This non-identity is, for Adorno, itself the key to any possible redemptive relationship of a subject to truth. By contrast with both of these, Badiou's theory of the event insists upon a wholly positive and affirmative relationship of a subject to the realization of a truth. Here, the yield of the subject's fidelity to an event is neither the subject's progressive self-realization nor simply its negative-dialectical power of resistance to the conceptual claim of a falsely reified whole. It is, rather, the paradoxical demonstration of the inherence of the infinite structure of a truth within the finitude of a specific situation, and must essentially bear the positivity of such a structure prior to and independently of any operation of negation.

 In partially similar terms, though with closer attention to the role of artistic truth, Rok Benčin's article reads Adorno and Badiou as linked in proposing a "peculiar dialectics of form and affect"; for both, the immanent liberating or transformative possibilities of art are to be understood through the dialectic by which truth progressively unfolds from the tension between form and sensory material. For both philosophers, then, "form remains the element in which truth is unfolded in art" (p. 207). Nevertheless, according to Benčin, there remains a crucial difference: whereas for Adorno, it is the "violent relation" of form to material that disrupts the claims of form to yield identity, for Badiou the emphasis is rather on the affirmative and productive capacity of finite form in itself successively to produce truth as a kind of immediate "surplus" (pp. 215-16).

Collectively, the essays succeed admirably in positioning the essential concepts and operations of Badiou's philosophy in relation to the distinct traditions of German idealism, phenomenology, and negative dialectics. This yields not only a richly informed sense of the ways in which Badiou problematizes and transforms the philosophical operations and conceptions characteristic of these traditions, but also of how we may accordingly reread their central assumptions about such underlying philosophical categories as those of unity, identity, totality, being and appearance. Given the extent to which the essays operate primarily in the "compare and contrast" mode that requires the presupposition of common terms of analysis between differently motivated and situated projects, one can sometimes feel that they underestimate the depth of Badiou's conceptual challenge to these terms themselves. More specifically, since Badiou's formally grounded conceptuality radically challenges assumptions that are, arguably, operative in all of these "German" traditions as well as much of Western philosophy as a whole (for example, about the finitude of the subject, the mutual exclusiveness of being and appearance, or the logical consistency of being in itself), it may be that this challenge cannot be fully portrayed simply by assessing the anticipations and points of connection that link Badiou to these historical traditions. There is also little discussion here of the formal-logical and mathematical structures and results about incompleteness, inconsistency, and the transfinite that most directly motivate these deep challenges within Badiou's own argumentation. Nevertheless, these essays will be both illuminating and rewarding for all those who have an interest in the legacies of these philosophical movements, or in the contemporary possibilities for a new, formally motivated thinking of the central categories of philosophical thought that figure within them.