Badiou and the Philosophers: Interrogating 1960s French Philosophy

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Tzuchien Tho and Giuseppe Bianco (eds., trs.), Badiou and the Philosophers: Interrogating 1960s French Philosophy, Bloomsbury, 2013, 165pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441195210.

Reviewed by Tom Eyers, Duquesne University


What are we to make of the recent ascendance of Alain Badiou to the position of general representative of French philosophy in the Anglophone humanities? There are multiple possible explanations, none of which seem immediately convincing on their own. Perhaps there is a general exhaustion with the linguistic focus of priorly dominant movements, most obviously deconstruction, inciting the fashion for Badiou at the same moment that it has birthed the rather different resurgence of Continental metaphysical realisms. It could well be that, in the context of the consensual liberal politics that befogged Anglophone academe in the 1980s and 1990s, an unrepentant Communist 68'er with no time for centrist equivocation provides a desperate gasp of fresh air otherwise unavailable; this writer, at least, would take the ambition and iconoclasm of a Badiou over the elite liberalism of a Martha Nussbaum any day. That said, Badiou and the new metaphysicians' frequently hasty dismissals of Derrida and other, prior exemplars of the Anglophone-Continental philosophical firmament are often tiresomely superficial, and they threaten to tether the current generation to a parochialism of the eternal intellectual present.

The new 'speculative realist' metaphysicians can be read as part of a broader movement away from critique in the humanities, one that, despite its internal heterogeneity, tends toward the same, implicit conclusion: philosophical modernity, with its stubborn focus on the paradoxes of signification, with its gritty political partisanship and critical verve, is over; indeed, it may never have existed -- and a good thing, too. This is the explicit conclusion of Bruno Latour, whose 1991 book We Have Never Been Modern set the tone for the anti-critical movement only now gaining its full voice. None of those involved agree on everything, of course, but they're differently representative of a trend that seems to be on the up in domains as varied as philosophy, political theory, literary criticism and cultural anthropology.

In literary studies, for example, the imperatives of critique (or 'suspicious reading') are increasingly being replaced by various kinds of 'sympathetic' or 'surface' reading, such a move generating the repetition of older historicisms and positivisms at least as often as it induces genuine theoretical novelty (see, in this regard, the work of Franco Moretti, Stephen Marcus and Sharon Best, among others). Academic fashions never march in strict lockstep with wider sociopolitical developments, of course, but it's tempting to hear the rise of the anti-critical humanities (to say nothing of that especially worrisome blot on the horizon, the 'neurohumanities') as the less-than-thunderous aftershock of the comprehensive and painful defeat of the Marxist Left in the West since 1989.

But even as Badiou marks a break with earlier, linguistically-oriented forms of French philosophy, he is as doggedly faithful to the modernist radical Left as the new anti-critics are determined to leave it behind. Badiou is nothing if not a thinker of grand Truths, both philosophical and political, and the volume under review, nimbly edited by young philosophers of note Tzuchien Tho and Giuseppe Bianco, gives readers an insight into the very earliest moments of the militant philosopher's development. At one and the same time, the book offers us glimpses of the pre-1968 generation that Badiou and his peers would take intellectual sustenance from, filtered through questions asked by a precocious 27-year-old Badiou as part of a unique series of television interviews, broadcast by the French state broadcaster between 1965 and 1968. (The cessation of the series in that year is worth underlining, whether or not les événements had anything directly to do with it). The transcripts of the interviews with Jean Hyppolite, Michel Foucault, Georges Canguilhem, Raymond Aron, Paul Ricoeur, Michel Henry and Michel Serres have been carefully edited and translated by Tho and Bianco, and the latter have penned a lengthy introduction that situates the text within concurrent developments in French politics and media culture.

There are a number of benefits to be gleaned from reading these interviews, advantages that supersede the undeniable initial thrill that comes from encountering thinkers, already eminent at the time they were interviewed, struggling to summarize their life's work on the spot and within the confines of a newly dominant cultural medium. At the very least, one gets a sense of just how crucial this mostly older generation of philosophers was to the famous upstarts -- Lacan, Derrida, Kristeva, Badiou himself -- who were beginning to make their mark as the interviews aired; an understanding, in other words, of how the apparently irrevocable break that structuralism and post-structuralism inflicted in the late 1960s may have been less absolute than previously assumed.

Especially instructive in this regard is Badiou's interview with Canguilhem, a philosopher of science whose wide-ranging impact on recent French thought has only very recently received its due in the Anglophone literature.[1] Canguilhem tends to be lumped together with Gaston Bachelard, Alexandre Koyré and occasionally with the lesser-known Jean Cavaillès, all four assumed to have understood scientific progress in austerely rationalist, mathematical terms. But unlike the latter three, for whom the physico-chemical sciences represented true scientific maturity, Canguilhem focused his attention on the life sciences, even taking vitalism seriously in his attempt to specify the true object of biological inquiry, namely life itself -- and this despite his undeniable commitment to mathematical formalization as the condition of scientificity. Canguilhem, in other words, bridged the supposed divide between philosophies of life and philosophies of the concept in 20th Century French thought before such a typology had even been definitively proposed, a proposition that found its most influential iteration, with due irony, in Foucault's introduction to a reprint of Canguilhem's own The Normal and the Pathological in 1966.

Canguilhem's responses to Badiou's probing questions are revealing of a more general tension in the relative position of science vis-á-vis philosophy in the French thought of the time, a tension that would then be reproduced in Badiou's mature writings. After being asked whether the expression 'scientific knowledge' is a pleonasm, Canguilhem responds in the affirmative: "You understand me perfectly correctly. This is what I mean. Knowledge that is not scientific is not knowledge" (18). Canguilhem, and the thinking on science that coursed through the work of Althusser and others around the same time, tends in this regard to a kind of Cartesianism; in the same interview, Canguilhem refers to 'vulgar knowledge', an equivalent in some respects to the deceitful sensory impressions that, at least in his more Platonic moments, Descartes disdained. The upshot is that philosophy is to be subordinated to the sciences, an insistence that Badiou would simultaneously accommodate and transform with his much later argument, outlined with the fullest force in his Being and Event (1988), that philosophy as such has no object; rather, he would argue, it is variously conditioned by the autonomous domains of politics, love, science and art.

And yet, Badiou's own variant of Platonism reserves a place for philosophy in its ability to discern the connections between the truths emergent in those knowledge practices that condition it, and we see a comparable recognition by Canguilhem in his 1965 interview. As he states, echoing Badiou's pronouncements from the 1980s, "There is no convention for philosophy in the way that there is in mathematics; in philosophy there is no limited object. . . . Philosophy is a project that concerns a totality. Philosophy cannot be less than science, we need it to conserve scientific truth" (25). Even more than this, Canguilhem would make clear in publications contemporaneous with his interview that the pulse of life itself is always to be understood as continuous with any subsequent elaboration of conceptual knowledge; as he would insist in his La connaissance de la vie (1965), life, understood as the sum of the agonistic interactions of an organism with its milieu, generates as a necessary consequence lesser or greater forms of knowledge, dependent on the complexity of the organism and milieu in question.

At one and the same time, then, Canguilhem can be seen to foreground conceptual knowledge as the privileged material of philosophical reflection, even while tenaciously holding to the predominance of science as a practice, especially those sciences that give us access to the stuff of life itself; as he comments in his interview, "[one may] regar[d] science not as an autonomous discipline but as a mode of activity having [certain] results . . . as a form of human spirit". (26). Scientific activity, for Canguilhem, connects us with the most essential of human properties, with what sets complex living matter aside from the inert. In this respect, science as an activity pictures the continuity of knowledge and life in a manner that philosophy, in its disconnection of theory from praxis, cannot. Philosophy is, somehow, both exalted and humbled in such an outlook.

This anxiety, one that attends any attempt to define what philosophy precisely is in its relation with and distinction from the physical and human sciences, can be discerned in many of the interviews contained in this volume. In his interview from 1965 on the topic 'What is Psychology?', Foucault pushes beyond Canguilhem's veneration of science per se, asking not whether psychology attains the level of scientific discourse but rather seeking to "interrogate psychology like we would interrogate any cultural form" (48). Pressed on the definition of cultural form, Foucault offers a version of his archaeological method: "Well, by 'cultural form' I understand, if you like, the manner in which a given culture such as an organized or institutionalized knowledge frees up a language that is proper to it and eventually reaches a form that one could call 'scientific'" (48). From the singular truth of science in its access to life in Canguilhem, to a multiplication of truths proper to particular regimes of cultural legibility in Foucault.

The question of history is crucial, too, to Badiou's conversation with Foucault. In remarks that resonate, once again, with Badiou's own mature thought, Foucault insists: "I am a fierce partisan of an evental [événementielle] view of history at least in philosophy since, after all, until now, we have never taken up the history of thought except for in abstract terms and general structure, through the ideal and the atemporal" (53). For the later Badiou, of course, the domain of the event is not to be found within philosophy, which is restricted to plotting the 'compossibility' of events in politics, love, art and science. Nevertheless, this emphasis on discontinuity, and equally on the dangers of thinking history as continuity, is another theme that threads through the interviews collected here. In comments made during a fascinating group discussion between Canguilhem, Dina Dreyfus, Hyppolite, Ricoeur and Badiou, Hyppolite nuances what threatens to seem a merely abstract valorization of the new: "it follows that there was in our history . . . points of novelty . . . essential at certain moments, but this does not make the dialogue with . . . past philosophers disappear . . . . But in order to think about an epoch it is also essential to think of its novelty, do you agree?" (92). It's a characteristically dialectical qualification by France's foremost Hegelian.

If there's a blind spot in Badiou's recent philosophical system-building, it is surely his relative silence on the question of language. In attempting to move beyond what he sees as the political paralysis of the 'linguistic turn', Badiou has bent the stick too far in the other direction, a misstep that his recent book on Wittgenstein has arguably done little to resolve. It is of particular interest, then, to read Badiou's interview with Ricoeur, conducted in 1965; Badiou's opening question, tellingly, is "Does the philosopher have any particular reason to be interested in language?" (61). Ricoeur responds: "philosophy is in a struggle with its own language" (61), one that he goes on to associate with polysemy. He insists that "metaphor is . . . just as central in the constitution of our discourse as that of discrete units of language since at each moment meaning is larger than the meaning that we transmit" (64). One imagines Derrida waiting eagerly in the wings.

It would be remiss of me not to mention in a little more detail the long and informative introduction to the volume, composed jointly by the editors. Spanning the period 1957-67, Tho and Bianco give color and life to what many have, wrongly, seen as the mere precursory period to the irruption of 'French theory' proper. As they write, "in resisting the attempt to look 'backwards' from the late 1960s and 1970s, we have tried to provide in the following a series of perspectives that might allow us to look 'forward'" (xii). It's a tall order for a 30 page introduction, but the editors make a good fist of it, skillfully weaving Badiou's biographical history into a set of more general reflections on, among other things, the lingering importance of Sartre's influence on the 60s generation, and on Hyppolite's still underappreciated role in providing "active guardianship" for the "the major philosophical creations of the 1960s" (xxii). Tho and Bianco are good on the institutional developments that enabled such an intense period of philosophical creativity, and while there are a few lapses in style, their introduction serves as a dynamic frame through which to view the interviews that follow. It remains to be seen whether Badiou's exciting, problematic, unswervingly ambitious project will help to reenergize the project of critique that is otherwise, as I lamented at the outset, under increasing attack in the humanities, but this book will, if nothing else, serve to further complicate our often too-neat understandings of the dynamics and debates of postwar French philosophy.

[1] See P. Rabinow, 'Introduction: A Vital Rationalist' in G. Canguilhem, A Vital Rationalist: Selected Writings From Georges Canguilhem, ed. F. Delaporte, (New York: Zone Books, 2000), 11-25; N. Rose, 'Life, Reason and History: Reading Georges Canguilhem Today' in Economy and Society 27. 2-3, 1998, 154-170; T. Eyers, Post-Rationalism: Psychoanalysis, Epistemology and Marxism in Postwar France, (London: Bloomsbury, 2013), 153-191.