Badiou, Balibar, Rancière: Re-thinking Emancipation

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Nick Hewlett, Badiou, Balibar, Rancière: Re-thinking Emancipation, Continuum, 2007, 179pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826498618.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


Badiou, Balibar, Rancière is a critical overview of the political thought of three students of Althusser's, each of whom has moved away from his teacher in a direction different from the others.  Hewlett argues that, in a France and indeed in a world that is increasingly neoliberal in both its thought and its practice, there is a need for a renewal of a left theoretical tradition.  Each of these thinkers attempts to offer that renewal, with, in Hewlett's eyes, mixed success.

The book can be read both as an overview of the work of these thinkers and as a critical engagement with them.  However, since the discussions are brisk and often introductory, the critical questions raised to these thinkers do not (and, I believe, do not seek to) have much depth.  I will argue that, at least in the case of Badiou, there are straightforward ways to answer the criticisms Hewlett raises.  However, it should be said immediately that, aside from the criticisms, the overview he provides of each thinker is valuable, and in the cases of Badiou and Rancière, fairly accurate.  As I am not a scholar of Balibar's thought, I cannot comfortably offer judgment of his efforts there.

The book proceeds in the standard fashion of such works.  The first chapter places the thinkers in their intellectual and historical context, particularly with respect to Althusser.  The second and third chapters are devoted to Alain Badiou.  The second chapter treats his central concepts of event, subject, and truth, while the third builds upon these an understanding of the framework of his political thought.  The fourth chapter is devoted to Jacques Rancière, whose thought is closer to Badiou's than is Balibar's.  Next is a chapter on Etienne Balibar, followed by a concluding chapter summarizing the earlier treatments and offering some final critical remarks.

The chapter on Badiou's central concepts discusses the centrality of the event for Badiou and shows how both the subject and the concept of a universal truth derive from it.  The subject is that which is loyal to an event, and a truth is that which is created through that fidelity.  In this chapter Hewlett raises the concern, to which he returns in the following chapter, that an event arises as something inexplicable, which is, in his view, "perhaps the most difficult aspect of the event to accept" (p. 39).  The specifically political problem with this inexplicability is that it does not offer a sense of the historical rootedness of events, and therefore makes them a mystery.  That, in turn, prevents the possibility of political guidance.  Events just happen, without anyone's control, and the possibility of fidelity only comes afterwards. 

Once the event has happened the subject becomes crucial to the event's (retrospective) existence and significance …  For a committed view of politics, and one which is arguably highly influenced by the notion of praxis, it is rather odd that the role of the activist is so retrospective in relation to the event. (p. 55)

Here I believe that Hewlett misinterprets the movement of Badiou's thought.  For Badiou, the event is not something that arises mysteriously.  Rather, it is mysterious only from the standpoint of the particular situation in which it happens.  It can be recognized as an event only retrospectively, because some interventions (political or otherwise) fail to catalyze an event.  When Rosa Parks refuses to give up her bus seat to a white person in Montgomery, Alabama in 1955, this is an event.  There were others before her who also refused.  What makes her refusal an event is the fidelity to her act by other committed activists.  And it is only in retrospect that we realize that hers was an event while the previous refusals were not.

Essentially, what Hewlett describes as the removal of an event from history seems to me more like a decision to act that cannot be predicted solely from the events leading up to that decision.  As Badiou makes clear in Being and Event, events can only arise at certain places in a situation -- places he calls evental sites.  They are historically and contextually rooted and circumscribed.  What they are not is historically determined.  That is where decision, action, and fidelity enter the picture.

Hewlett's other major criticism, that there is a disconnect between the abstraction of Badiou's thought and the specifics of his political commitments and analyses, is one that he also raises against Rancière.  I think there is more merit to this objection, although it, too, can be answered.  In their theoretical works, Badiou and Rancière seek to offer a framework for thinking political action.  For Badiou, that framework revolves around a conception of an event.  For Rancière, it is founded in collective action emerging from the presupposition of radical equality.  The proper question to raise to these frameworks, it seems to me, is not whether they are close to or distant from concrete political contexts, but rather whether they help enlighten our thought about those contexts.  Here, of course, there is much room for discussion.

I have recently studied and written on the political views of Rancière, and I find Hewlett's brief treatment of Rancière's views to be admirably clear.  I like his characterization of Rancière's position as "a statement both of the right of the ordinary person to be listened to and a celebration of the profound usefulness of learning from what the ordinary person has to say, unmediated as far as possible by the intervention of the more powerful" (p. 86).  Hewlett offers a good overview of the development of Rancière's often far-flung thought (at least his political thought), and raises an objection that I, too, have pondered. 

How could the sans-part, whom Rancière promotes so effectively in his theory, ever play a full and positive role in a democratically organized society if the very existence of democracy depends on their playing a marginal role and being in an apparently constant state of revolt? (p. 111)

In short, how can we institutionalize the democratic moment that Rancière has conceived?  Elsewhere I try to respond to this question, but it does involve some re-arrangement of elements of his thought.

If Hewlett finds Badiou's and Rancière's thought too distant from concrete realities, he finds Balibar's rather too close at times.  Balibar's approach is often to engage directly with issues such as violence or citizenship.  Such an approach, by lacking the proper theoretical distance from current events, runs the risk of being too much in thrall to the perceived parameters of the context of those events.  As a result, while Balibar offers elucidating moments of thought about the issues he addresses, his proposals wind up being a bit reformist and in that way foreign to the radicality of his reflections.

A general worry that concerns Hewlett is the distance of these thinkers, particularly Badiou and Rancière, from economic issues.  He finds what might be called a political reductionism in their views, a stress on the political at the expense of the economic.  Here he suggests that a return to Marx's view might offer a corrective.  This is a provocative idea.  I believe there is a reason, which is not to say a justification, for the stress these thinkers place on the political.  In our neoliberal world, it is precisely the political that has been eclipsed in favor of the economic.  Solve the economic problems (through the introduction of a world free market) and politics will fall into line of its own accord.  In fact, the reason, according to many neoliberal thinkers, that we suffer from hardship and discontent is that states and politics stand in the way of the natural development of a global market.

It is easy, and correct, to see these neoliberal ideas as fantasies, fantasies of the rich.  By reintroducing and emphasizing the political, Badiou and Rancière in particular have tried to offer a corrective to both an economistic Marx and, at the other economic extreme, neoliberalism.  However, I don't believe that there is a theoretical symmetry between politics and economics.  To think of economics politically does not necessarily involve a reductionism.  For instance, for workers to organize for equal pay is at once economic and political.  If the political is seen as ultimately economic, that betrays the integrity of the political.  But if the economic is seen as ultimately political, that does not necessarily betray the integrity of the economic.  What Badiou and especially Rancière offer is a way of characterizing the political that, it seems to me, can take on board economic concerns without betraying them.  This particular development of their thought is not a major concern of theirs.  However, I do not see that their framework precludes it.

Although I have disagreed here with several of Hewlett's criticisms of the figures he treats, this should not be read as an indictment of the book.  I much appreciate the clarity with which he characterizes these figures as well as the forthrightness with which he engages them.  There seem to me to be a few unsympathetic mischaracterizations here.  On the other hand, for those beginning to approach these thinkers, one could do far worse than to start with this book.