Badiou's Being and Event and the Mathematics of Set Theory

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Burhanuddin Baki, Badiou's Being and Event and the Mathematics of Set Theory, Bloomsbury, 2015, 273pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472524454.

Reviewed by Paul M. Livingston, University of New Mexico


Alain Badiou's ontological thought inherits the preoccupation, characteristic of much recent continental philosophy (from Heidegger, Sartre, and Adorno to Derrida, Levinas, and Deleuze), with the difference between the static and regular order of self-identical being, and whatever unpredictably exceeds, surprises, or disrupts this order, leading to its possible transformation. But what distinguishes Badiou's thought in this context, and also secures its relevance to concerns historically typical of analytic philosophy, is his provocative and rigorous use of mathematical formalism to theorize this difference. In his 1988 masterpiece Being and Event, Badiou applies the apparatus of set theory to model both the "ontological" structure of existing and knowable entities and situations, and structurally transformative "events," theorizing along the way the procedures of "fidelity" that draw out the situational consequences of an event, the nature of "subjects" defined by their pursuit of these procedures, and the generic "truths" to which these procedures are, on Badiou's account, definitively related.

Bold as it is, Badiou's strategy risks incomprehension, at least in contexts of discussion still determined by the analytic-continental divide. It is a familiar and regrettable feature of the contemporary philosophical landscape that philosophers fluent in the discussion of subjectivity, political action, social transformation, and related topics are often not equally conversant in contemporary techniques of mathematical and logical formalism. At the same time, philosophers with a background including these formal techniques may not be in a position immediately to see their relevance to these more typically "continental" concerns. Burhanuddin Baki's book succeeds admirably in remedying both of these kinds of gap through its detailed reading of Being and Event and clear, accessible presentation of the set theory upon which it is based.

Baki begins by critically considering the radical identification that frames Badiou's theory of the structural nature of what is as such. This is the identification of "ontology", or the order of being insofar as it can be consistently described, with "mathematics" in the specific sense of that which is axiomatized by ZFC set theory (Zermelo--Fraenkel set theory with the axiom of choice). "Ontology," it is important to note, does not denote here (as it does in some recent analytic discussions) either an inventory of extant entities or an illumination of their mereology, conditions of identity, or overall categorial structure. As Baki explains (pp. 24-25), Badiou is not claiming, for example, that everything is a set or that all entities or structures can be reduced to mathematical ones. Rather, the sense of "ontology" here is closer to that in which it is developed by Heidegger or Sartre in the (other) two famous "Being and . . . " books of the twentieth century: that of a theoretical clarification of the meaning of "being" in the most basic terms or of the most general and abstract formal and structural conditions for anything to exist at all. For Badiou, in particular, set-theoretical ontology is a theory of the general formal conditions for the consistent presentation of any existing thing: the conditions under which it is able to be "counted-as-one" and coherent as a unity. Whereas being in itself, for Badiou, is simply "pure inconsistent multiplicity" -- multiple-being without any organizing structure, overall unity, or centering basis -- it is made available for comprehension and presentation by the "counting-as-one" that is modelled by the axiomatic theory of sets. The axiomatic theory of the conditions of set existence and formation, including decisively the Cantorian and post-Cantorian theory of infinite and transfinite sets, thus captures, for Badiou, the basic sense of "being" as it constrains the unity and multiplicity of whatever is in relation to the coherence of the presentational concepts under which it can be thought.

Badiou's bold identification of ontology with mathematics in this sense is in part, as Baki notes, a provocation to the tradition on which ontological research is a distinctively philosophical activity, for instance one dependent upon some intuitive or interpretive resource of essentially extra-formal insight or discovery. But the provocation also yields a wealth of positive consequences for the "metaontological" theory of the nature and proper methods of ontological inquiry. For example, one of the central gambits of Badiou's strategy is that the axiomatic structure of set theory allows it to account for the ground-level structure of ontological presentation without thereby lodging this structure in the specific identity of any extant being or any description or definition thereof. Since axiomatic set theory does not explicitly define such basic notions as set membership and the unity of what can be gathered together as a set, instead leaving them to be articulated implicitly through the functioning of the axioms themselves, it may be considered to theorize through them the general basis of presentational consistency without attributing this basis to any further ontic ground or locating it in any particular presented being. As Baki correctly notes (pp. 13-14), Badiou's project is thus, in part, a "more radical continuation of Heidegger's deconstruction of metaphysics," especially in its formally principled rejection of what Heidegger called "onto-theological" interpretations of being, namely those that lodge it ultimately in some kind of originary entity or ontic explanatory first principle.

Here as elsewhere, Baki's discussion of the underlying formalism skillfully relates Badiou to his more or less recent historical antecedents and the broader history of philosophy while also significantly illuminating what is actually at stake in Badiou's own relatively novel formal approach. At other points, Baki's sensitive probing of the implications of the formal issues helps to illuminate points of argument or connection that might otherwise remain obscure even to a formally sophisticated reader. For instance, as Baki notes, Badiou speaks of "consistency" in at least two apparently distinct senses: first, in relation to his own interpretation of pure being as "inconsistent" multiplicity and of the set-theoretical "count-as-one" as producing or imposing the "consistency" of any presented being or regime of presentation; and second, in the more familiar sense of the issue of the (syntactic) consistency of a formal theory. Again, Badiou speaks of a situation's foundational or void elements as points at which it is threatened by an underlying inconsistency and of the power set, or what Badiou terms the "state," as producing a securing re-count that prevents the situation from encountering this underlying inconsistency in propria persona. It is not entirely clear what these various senses of "inconsistency" have to do with one another: how is the (syntactical) consistency of the formal theory of ZFC linked to the ontological and metaontological issues of the structure and limits of "consistent" presentation? But Baki plausibly suggests that the connection is to be found in part by considering the model-theoretic implications of Gödel's completeness theorem, which guarantees (on one of its formulations) the existence of a (semantic) model for any syntactically consistent theory formulated in terms of first-order logic. Although the theorem is discussed only briefly and in passing by Badiou himself, this connection serves, on Baki's suggestion, also adequately to link the implications of undecidable statements, including importantly the undecidability of Cantor's Continuum Hypothesis (CH) on the basis of the ZFC axioms, to the more directly metaontological issues of the structure of possible regimes of presentation and their potential transformation.

Baki's interpretation next proceeds through clear and helpful explanations of the main set-theoretic and model-theoretic schemas and results employed by Badiou in his account of the structure of the event, the form of its typical prohibition or obscuration within normative regimes of existing knowledge, the possibility of the generic procedures of fidelity that nevertheless can (according to Badiou) draw out its radical and transformative consequences, and finally the nature of the subject who is the faithful operator of such a procedure. Baki provides clear and accessible explanations, for example, of the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem, Skolem's "paradox," Gödel's development of the "constructible" universe L and his proof, using it, of the consistency of CH relative to ZFC, and finally Cohen's apparatus of forcing and its use in showing the full independence of CH from the axioms. Badiou models the event itself as a special kind of self-membered set, actually prohibited within ZFC itself through one of its axioms, the Axiom of Foundation. The event is thus ontologically "illegal", in a certain way beyond or outside the being of what is as structured by ZFC, but it is nevertheless possible to understand its potential situational consequences relative to differing conceptions of the overall structure of sets in relation to linguistic predication by tracing out the distinctive implications of these differing conceptions. For instance, Badiou treats the constructible universe, in which the formation of power sets is strictly regulated by means of the formulas of a predicative language, as a kind of illustrative formalization of a pervasive general orientation of thought, what Badiou calls the "constructivist" orientation. On this orientation, novelty and situational transformation are structurally limited by the resources of an existing language, and it follows that neither an event, in Badiou's sense, nor its radically transformative situational consequences are here possible. On the other hand, outside the constructivist orientation, Cohen's method of forcing is used to model in detail the structure of the radical consequences that, according to Badiou, can emerge from the progressive activity of a "subject" in discerning an initially indiscernible generic part of an existing situation and progressively determining the new truths that will now hold in the transformed situation to be produced through this activity. Baki's clear, accessible, and insightful explanations of all of these formalisms have the further merit of allowing the reader to place them in a broader context of metamathematical and metalogical reasoning. For example, one significant merit of Baki's presentation of forcing is that it makes explicit the very close connections between this procedure and Cantor's more general methodology of diagonalization, with its wide variety of set-theoretic, metalogical, and philosophically suggestive applications.

In all of these methods as well as Badiou's use of them, set-theoretic and model-theoretic issues are deeply and sometimes inextricably entwined. Badiou himself often treats the existence of models, as witnessed by the formal arguments, as philosophically decisive with respect to the issues about language, subjectivity, and evental transformation that he considers or at least as allowing these issues to be decided by militant intervention or philosophical fiat whenever they are demonstrably not settled by ontology (i.e. the ZFC axioms) alone. This leads to a number of broader questions about Badiou's particular way of interpreting the formalisms, several of which Baki illuminatingly discusses in a somewhat more critical register. One such issue arises from the necessarily infinite extent of any generic set. Because, in order actually to be indiscernible in the original situation in which it exists, any generic set must differ from every set that is identified within that situation by any finite determination, it is never possible to verify conclusively whether a subjective procedure is indeed a generic one at any finite point in its development (p. 222). All that sustains this determination is, according to Badiou, the subject's own free decision, founded ultimately in her fidelity beyond any possibility of knowledge.[1] In theorizing subjective activity as exemplifying generic procedures in this sense, Badiou thus appears to presume a correspondence between mathematical results and intra-situational phenomena that could only be witnessed from a kind of absolute perspective that is not obviously available to finite subjects at all while nevertheless ascribing to the intra-situational subject a decisionist power to maintain this very correspondence within the situation itself.

As Baki brings out, another set of issues which may impair the coherence of Badiou's argument overall surrounds the connection he seeks to draw between the event and the faithful operation of "its" generic procedure. On Badiou's interpretation, the subject's generic procedure is, in part, an investigation into whether the various elements of its situation are "positively" or "negatively" linked to the event in such a way as to force particular post-evental truths, but the manner and meaning of this linkage remains almost entirely obscure. And as Baki points out, it is not clear that the linkage Badiou wishes to draw between these two essential parts of his theory of situational transformation is justified or even motivated by anything on the level of the formalisms themselves. Whereas the event is, because of its self-membership and hence its violation of the ZFC axioms, ontologically "illegal," the forcing procedure itself takes place, at least on Cohen's development of it, entirely within the legality of ZFC and its own possible "inner models." Not only is it not, as Baki points out, an evident necessity that forcing must take place within a situation of the type Badiou terms "historical" rather than one exhibiting the kind of regular ontological structure that he instead terms "natural," but also there is nothing in Cohen's procedure itself to suggest that it must begin with (or contain at any moment of its progress) the kind of self-membered and ontologically "illegal" structure that the event is, according to Badiou (p. 249). Thus it appears that both the essential linkage of the event to the possible situational transformation it officially conditions and their further relationships to the stable regime of ontology demarcated by the ZFC axioms still remain to be motivated or clarified.

As Badiou's formidable edifice of thought continues to be received and debated within increasingly broad discussions continuous with both the "analytic" and "continental" traditions, a good understanding of his formalisms will be increasingly necessary in order to assess its real implications for the issues at stake. This assessment may involve probing evidently close formal connections such as (as Baki points out) that between Badiou's application of forcing and its role within Kripkean semantics for modal logic. But it is likely also to involve considering the bearing on Badiou's argument of key problems and questions debated by analytic philosophers in recent decades. These may include, for example, the question of the structure of truth (following Tarski and Davidson), that of the foundations of semantics (after Putnam's "model-theoretic" arguments) and, perhaps most broadly, the nature of rules and rule-following given the problem drawn by Kripke from Wittgenstein. In each of these connections, what is at issue is not simply the correct philosophical application of particular mathematical or logical structures but also the more deeply methodological question of how and in what specific configurations these formal structures gain practical bearing on language or the world at all. Thus each of them thus calls, in different ways, for a continuation of the radical reflection on the consequences of forms and their transformation that Badiou's work has effectively begun. Whatever trajectory this developing reflection may eventually take, there is little doubt that Baki's careful parsing of Badiou's use of formalism will provide an invaluable resource for those pursuing it.

[1] This point was also made by Z. L. Fraser in "The Law of the Subject: Alain Badiou, Luitzen Brouwer and the Kripkean Analyses of Forcing and the Heyting Calculus," Cosmos and History 2(1-2): pp. 94-133.