Badiou's Deleuze

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Jon Roffe, Badiou's Deleuze, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2012, 196pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 978-0773540088.

Reviewed by Bruno Besana, Berlin Institute for Cultural Inquiry


1.  A singular adversary

I tend to think that there are three main categories under which one can file theoretical books one dislikes. The first contains what I consider, for various reasons, bad books: insignificant topics, inaccurate development, incoherent construction, etc. Very often such texts are structured around current, widely shared opinions -- for instance they depend, in an unreflected manner, upon consensual academic perspectives of research in the history of philosophy. Following Deleuze's allergy to determinate negation, i.e. following the idea that no novelty in thought comes from arguing against a given consensual content -- but also following Badiou's recommendation to think without relation, at a distance from the forms of representations of the present -- one should try to avoid commenting upon such texts.

The second category itself falls under the first, and it contains those elements of the first that constitute an immediate danger. In fact, it could happen that the reader, although she tends to disregard all unimportant, consensual or commonsensical texts, still senses the urge to engage in a battle against some such books, because they are used as means of homogenizing thought, as agents of the dissolution of thought into an harmless circulation of opinions. Only a studious evaluation of the impact of a text can determine whether it fits into the first or the second category.

One can call the books in the first category 'objects' (as they are fundamentally inert, having no or very low subjective capacity to change the present), and the books in the second category 'enemies' (as they are used to transform a field of thought into a field of immobile, dead objects, useful only to the analytical gaze of an historian of ideas).

Third comes the odd category of books that display a set of theses or a style with which it is impossible to agree, but which, at the same time, engage us in thought and oblige us to proceed in new, unthought directions -- directions which are not contained in those books, but which are opened in the struggle with them. These books are the ones against which we should unleash the most violent, deadly force of polemics, in a fashion analogous to a revolutionary process which -- as Badiou states -- can only proceed through the construction of a real novelty by identifying and "exterminating" internal adversaries, rather than focusing solely on external enemies. One can call these books 'adversaries' -- books that cannot be avoided, as they constantly torment us, thus forcing us to the infinite attempt to destroy them.

I consider Alain Badiou's Deleuze -- the Clamour of Being to be one of the highlights of this third category -- a sentiment that I seem to share with Jon Roffe who, after 160 pages of a monotonous, restless and stubborn attack aiming at a systematic destruction of Badiou's book, writes: "the manner of his [Badiou's] approach to Deleuze, his resolutely principled and philosophical mode of engagement, have provided one of the most significant incitements yet to Deleuze's readers, an incitement that is at once philosophical, rigorous and profound" (p. 161). In other words: after years of post-modern mumbo-jumbo readings of Deleuze, Badiou has the audacity to read Deleuze philosophically, engaging in his concepts of time, of truth/faking, and in the logic of individuation suggesting (oh sacrilege for the Deleuzians!) that a concept of the subject is active in Deleuze.  More importantly, as Roffe reminds us, Badiou reads Deleuze starting directly from what he considers to be Deleuze's main ontological project: the attempt to found a philosophy of difference upon an ontology of pure multiplicity. This said, almost every single thesis of Badiou's book, according to Roffe, is fake; as a consequence of this, Roffe constructs his ferocious text in the form of a "procedure of testing" (p. 6), in which Badiou's theses are passed through an impressive amount of contrary textual evidence taken from Deleuze's vast bibliography.

As is well known, Badiou's book relies on the thesis that Deleuze fails in his ontological project -- a failure which is fundamentally due to the lack of a rigorous (i.e. mathematical) concept of multiplicity -- and fails so badly that ultimately multiplicity comes to be subordinated to a new identification of Being and the One, a primordial ontological unity of which each different actual being is an emanation. For Badiou, the immediate consequence is that in Deleuze the difference between actual beings is merely modal, since they are all expressions of the same.

Roffe's book is a vigorous attack against this thesis; an attack led by means of a well-informed analytic study of each of Badiou's criticisms of Deleuze. By targeting, with analytic fury, each thesis exposed by Badiou, Roffe aims at showing -- by means of a deluge of textual evidence -- what a 'correct' reading of Deleuze supposedly is. The problem is that the outcome is twofold and unanticipated: on the one hand, the book fails to engage with what it announces -- i.e., fails to uncover the philosophical reasons that lead Badiou to such 'mistakes'; on the other hand, one can read this book as one of the most brilliant, seriously structured and well-informed introductions to Deleuze ever written.

2. A non-astigmatic philosophical perspective on Deleuze

As an example of the second outcome, one can consider the very precise analysis regarding the historical genesis of the concept of the event that occupies chapter 6. This analysis starts from the overcoming of the essence/accident division in the thought of the first Stoa, then passes through the event qua predicate in Leibniz, and ends by scrutinizing the concept of disjunctive synthesis as affirmation of a divergence. One must also mention here how the last chapter displays a brilliant reading of the existence of a specific concept of the subject in Deleuze, by distinguishing it from the Kantian transcendental subject, from the psychological subject of consciousness, and ultimately from any identification with the empirical figure of the 'human' (see in particular pp. 145-147). Or again, one should mention his account of Deleuze's engagement with Kant's doctrine of faculties, which allows Roffe to formulate an insightful reading of Kant's distinction between reason and understanding as a basis upon which Deleuze can formulate his notion of "the problematic" (pp. 45 ff.). Also, his precise account of Deleuze's reading of the differential calculus deserves our utmost attention. Roffe argues that Deleuze's use of Leibniz's calculus is made possible by the fact that Deleuze separates the logical structure of the calculus from the supposed existence of infinitesimal quantities.  His "anti-quantitative reading of the calculus" (p. 53), enables an understanding of the differential relation as the foundation of the problematic nature of ideas "beyond the confines . . . of Kant's subject-oriented thought" (p. 50).

This book thus manages to produce a sharp philosophical reading of Deleuze, keeping at distance both the clumsiness of post-modernist guardians of Deleuze's temple, and the irrelevance of studies conducted from the perspective of the history of ideas. In other words, it manages to give, as Badiou does, a philosophical account of Deleuze's thought, but without sacrificing -- as allegedly Badiou does -- the textual evidence and the structural coherence of Deleuze's work on the altar of opposition.

3. A new 'personnage conceptuel': 'Badiou, the sloppy thinker'

Roffe achieves this mainly through a series of general, yet sharp, criticisms of Badiou's approach. Roffe's primary target consists of all the passages in Badiou's book that tend to read the actual in Deleuze as the mere surface of expression of the virtual, thus reducing all actual differences to pure modal ones, mere phantasmatic manifestations incapable of producing any difference or novelty. In this sense, for example, Roffe attacks Badiou's identification of actuality with passivity, and of virtuality with activity. Badiou's hermeneutical error would specifically consist in identifying Deleuze's actual with a mere passive surface of representation where no difference is produced, and in identifying the virtual with a unified creative force, a pure source of activity, whereas -- as Roffe shows -- Deleuze's virtual is at once irreducible to a closed unity and traversed by several forms of passivity (pp. 96 ff.). Or again, in his criticism of Badiou's interpretation of Deleuze's theory of time, Roffe shows how Badiou, reducing the triad present/past/future to the dyad Aïon/Chronos (i.e. to a mere relation between present/actual and past/virtual), finally expels from Deleuze's account of time any constitutive dimension of change (pp. 87 ff.).

In which sense then does this book -- which displays a coherent unfolding of the genesis and main articulations of Deleuze's thought, as well as a set of striking remarks exposing the objective limits of Badiou's reading of the latter -- end up being filed in the category of the 'adversary' books, sharing the place with the very book of which it is the merciless torturer? The point is that this book displays a set of perspectival distortions that make a fictional character of Badiou, at least as strange as the fictional character that Badiou makes of Deleuze. In other words, the exit of 'Deleuze, philosopher of the One' is only made possible by the creation of 'Badiou, the sloppy thinker', a strange character that completely lacks the very core from which derives the philosophical sense of the (unfair and indefensible) criticisms that Badiou addresses to Deleuze. A Badiou who reads Deleuze without a precise, thorough, articulated, almost axiomatically constructed agenda is as unbelievable as a Deleuze who would be the willing prophet of a metaphysics of the One, of an irreducible essence/phenomena dualism, and of the reduction of phenomena to mere phantasmata (or, in the best case, modal expressions) of an impassible Being.

From a textual point of view, Roffe does engage with Badiou's Deleuze: he aims at "demonstrating" (p.5) that Badiou's theses on Deleuze are false. In order to achieve this, he uses a fundamentally falsificationist methodology, a "procedure of testing" (p. 6) based upon the search for as much opposing textual evidence as possible. Such an approach -- Roffe doesn't seem to find relevant its possible inconsistency with both Deleuze's and Badiou's notion of fact - pushes him to claim that: "Badiou's thesis, according to which Deleuze mounts and defends a metaphysics of the One, functions not as a conclusion drawn on the basis of a careful study of the latter's text, but as an initial axiom, a filter or lens" (p. 5). But what is the relevance in trying to prove, via crucial experiments based on textual evidence, that Badiou is or is not reading Deleuze in a correct manner? What does this tell us about the reason for the profound opposition of Badiou toward Deleuze? Of course, as Roffe points out, Badiou is wrong in considering the virtual as a substantive unity, a unified force that expresses itself in a series of lines of actualization, of which actual beings are only mere effects.  Of course actual beings cannot simply be considered as modal, inert, passive effects unable to produce difference. Still, something is missing in the account of these hermeneutical mistakes.

In fact, one can very well maintain the validity of Badiou's commentary on Deleuze (without necessarily endorsing such a point of view), even after having acknowledged the presence of these major interpretative 'mistakes'. Moreover, the same passages in which Roffe proves Badiou wrong also confirm the Badiou's criticisms of Deleuze. For instance, Roffe announces in the beginning that "there is certainly a preoccupation with ontological unity in Deleuze, but this unity is the unity of manner rather than the unity of substance" (p. 23), and (after a series of very informative analyses) he concludes the book by stating:

"given that no pertinent set of criteria exists by which to speak of the virtual as a unified entity, any attempt to do so would necessarily involve the imposition of an external framework. Where the whole of the virtual can be legitimately thought is through the category of the individual. Each individual [a concept the explanation of which is one of the highlights of the book] expresses the entirety of the virtual field, but, in each case, it is a different 'aspect' or 'face' of the virtual: different differential relations and singular points are actualized in each case (p. 145).

These passages -- and all the carefully built arguments and analysis upon which they rely -- while attacking the unfairness of Badiou's critique, at the same time paradoxically confirm the reasons for Badiou's choice.  Each actual being is here presented as an expression of the same virtual, although such an expression is made possible through a specific perspectival axis, the emphasis on certain virtual disjunctive syntheses and the use of certain specific processes of actualisation. In other words, the problem raised by Badiou remains intact -- and unaddressed -- through Roffe's book: is it possible to think and produce difference and radical novelty, having as ontological support a theory of the virtual, intensive multiplicity? Badiou knows very well that, on a textual level, for Deleuze, Being is multiplicity and that univocity and unity are not the same.  If therefore Badiou attacks Deleuze's ontology of multiplicity, it is because he considers such an ontology of the virtual multiplicity (a multiplicity which, of course, is not a totality but a principle of differentiation, but which still is finally one multiplicity expressed in each individual actual being) to reduce each actual being to an expression of the same. Badiou identifies Deleuze's multiplicity with a unique principle of ontological difference that implies that all actual beings are mere manifestations of it, provided only with modal difference between them and, most importantly, limited to the expression of difference, rather than its production.

Badiou's heavy critical artillery -- namely his choice to attack Deleuze with an accusation that he cannot easily substantiate by textual evidence -- is due to the fact that Deleuze's expressive paradigm represents a serious threat to his own philosophical agenda.  He needs -- be it by hyperbolic means -- to stress the consequences implicit in a set of choices made by Deleuze. In a seminal article -- which Roffe very seldom quotes -- Badiou explains his own identity of intention with Deleuze's "conceptual program":

Deleuze was the first to properly grasp that a contemporary metaphysics must consist in a theory of multiplicities and an embrace of singularities . . . He clearly articulated the conviction that the truth of univocal Being can only be grasped by thinking its evental advent. This bold program is one which I also espouse.

It is from this indiscernibility that their incompossibility -- hence their restless opposition -- takes place: "obviously, I do not think Deleuze successfully accomplished it; or rather, I believe he gave it an inflection which led it in a direction opposite to the one I think it should take" (Alain Badiou, "One, Multiple, Multiplicity", in Alain Badiou, Theoretical Writings, London/New York, Continuum, 2004, p. 68). Specifically, for Badiou, "the intuition of the virtual . . . plays the role of transcendence". The consequence is that Deleuze's "attempt to subvert the 'vertical' transcendence of the One" through the concept of the virtual "produces a 'horizontal' or virtual transcendence which, instead of grasping singularity, ignores the intrinsic resource of the multiple (and) presupposes the chaotic power of the One" (ibid., p. 79).

Within a common paradigm, the point of fracture between the two authors -- in Badiou's perspective -- concerns the problem of the grasping -- and of the production -- of singularities, of moments of difference irreducible to any given classification of identities. Roffe's book manages to reconstruct Deleuze's thought in philosophical terms (as opposed to any superficial socio-cultural reading) without sacrificing it on the altar of polemical opposition.  However, in order to do so, he sacrifices on the same altar the philosophical perspective which supports the merciless battle that Badiou has engaged in with Deleuze around the requirement for ontology to think difference and support its production (i.e. around the requirements an ontology of multiplicity needs in order to break the identity between Being and unity).

Consistent with this, Roffe also sacrifices any analysis of Badiou's system that could have shed light on the philosophical sense of Badiou's reading of Deleuze. It is in fact striking to see how such a careful scholar can be brief and imprecise in portraying those elements of Badiou's philosophy directly connected with the theme of the book. In this regard, one can mention his account of Badiou's subject as being fundamentally anthropological (146-147), a complex theme which, in the logic of this book, would have required a full-scale discussion, especially in relation to Roffe's brilliant account of the non-anthropological nature of Deleuze's subject.  Or one can mention the explanation of Badiou's notion of fidelity, which in Roffe's brief account is uncritically reduced to an "unconscious construction" and to "the constitution of a counter-state" (p. 135). But, sadly, the list of the moments of (even insufficient) unpacking of the relation between the two authors is not much longer than this, and other references to Badiou's thought in the book are often reduced to semi-cryptic extra-dry résumés (see, above all, the account of how the relation between thought and being is founded by Badiou upon the concept of the null set, p. 130).

My aim has been to show the paradoxical nature of this singular book, which dramatically fails in the endeavour that its title announces (the philosophical analysis of the perspective line uniting Badiou's thought with Deleuze's oeuvre), and which, by means of the creation of an indefensible 'personnage conceptuel' ('Badiou, the sloppy thinker') actually becomes one of the most serious and meticulous philosophical introductions to Deleuze's thought to date. My opposition to this result, to this book, is total and uncompromised, but it is an opposition that will bind me for a long time to a continuous confrontation with it. A confrontation, that I strongly encourage the reader to embrace.