Basic Concepts of Aristotelian Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Martin Heidegger, Basic Concepts of Aristotelian Philosophy, Robert D. Metcalf and Mark B. Tanzer (trs.), Indiana UP, 2009, 279pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780253353498.

Reviewed by Richard Polt, Xavier University



This volume presents a lecture course delivered by Heidegger in Summer Semester 1924 at the University of Marburg in which he examines a variety of Aristotelian texts, elucidating key concepts and exploring how these concepts are rooted in the Greek experience of the world. The book was first published in German in 2002 as volume 18 of the collected edition of Heidegger’s writings. We now have access to many of Heidegger’s interpretations of Aristotle from the 1920s, and most of these are now available in English.1 Texts such as these make it clear that, despite the revolutionary impact of Being and Time (1927), Heidegger developed some of its central ideas by the most traditional of routes: commentary on the Philosopher.

To be sure, Heidegger’s is an unusual sort of commentary, which retrieves Aristotle as a proto-phenomenologist and reads him in terms of a larger agenda that is not always explicit. So it would be wrong to call Heidegger an Aristotelian, but it would also be wrong to say that he turns Aristotle into a Heideggerian. Such labels presume that a philosophy consists of a set of propositions to which a philosopher has given assent. But for Heidegger, propositional meaning depends on a deeper, lived engagement with one’s situation; he tries to cultivate that engagement in his students and himself by finding evidence of such engagement in Aristotle. In this way, antiquity may give a "jolt to the present, or better put, to the future" (5). No theorems of Aristotelian or Heideggerian philosophy are brought into a system here. Instead, by weaving through a wide range of Aristotle’s texts, Heidegger gradually familiarizes us with the Greek sense of being and tries to motivate us to attend to the phenomena just as seriously as Aristotle did (12, 229). If this is not what one expects from a philosopher, then Heidegger prefers not to call what he is doing philosophy at all: let it be called philology (4, 225). As for biographical considerations, he makes the famous statement, “Regarding the personality of a philosopher, our only interest is that he was born at a certain time, that he worked, and that he died” (4).2

The volume under review presents a major textual challenge that the editor, Mark Michalski, has met in a responsible and reasonable way. The frequent quotations and paraphrases from Aristotle and others require numerous footnotes; a more serious problem is that only about a third of Heidegger’s lecture notes are extant, and the rest of what Heidegger actually said must be reconstructed from student transcripts (not “Student Writings”, as the translation has it 1). Since Heidegger’s notes are brief and often cryptic, we must admire the improvisational skill with which he apparently delivered an organized, fleshed-out presentation at the lectern. We must also be grateful for the shorthand skills of Walter Bröcker and Gerhard Nebel, the students who recorded Heidegger’s spoken German and Greek (275); thanks to their efforts, we can imagine ourselves following along in the lecture hall in 1924.

If we had actually been there, we would have had some very gifted classmates, including Hans-Georg Gadamer, Helene Weiss, Jacob Klein, Hans Jonas, Leo Strauss, and Karl Löwith. These promising students were drawn to Marburg by a “rumor of the hidden king”, as Hannah Arendt, who joined them in the next semester, was to recall.3 Heidegger was developing a reputation for thinking in a fresh and exciting way, for bringing the ancients back to life, and even for reviving philosophy itself in Germany. Courses such as the one reconstructed in this volume were to inspire Heidegger’s students permanently, even if most came to resist his thought after the shock of his support for the Nazi regime.4

Heidegger does not begin to explore Aristotle’s “basic concepts” by defining them; instead, he sees the logical concept of definition as a “decline” that obscures genuine “conceptuality” (11). What Heidegger seeks to uncover in Aristotelian concepts is their Bodenständigkeit, translated here as “indigenous character”. In other words, the meaning of concepts is to be traced back to the ground on which they originally stood. This basis is a concrete experience of phenomena, and this “basic experience is primarily not theoretical, but instead lies in the commerce of life with its world” (12).

For instance, the central term ousia (usually rendered as being, substance, or essence) refers to possessions in ordinary Greek (18). The ontological concept grows from the everyday experience of owning and using things. This is not to suggest, however, that ordinary language provides a final answer to the meaning of ousia; it is only a “clue” (20). "Life moves in a natural intelligibility of that which is immediately meant by ‘being’ and ‘beings’ in its speaking" — but this average, everyday meaning is “worn out, used, used up” (21, 16). Ontological concepts grow from a familiar sense of being that is felt and lived, but philosophers must resist the thoughtless repetition of idle talk that is part of this ordinary experience (184-188). We must elucidate philosophical concepts neither through formal definitions nor through a simple appeal to common usage, but by digging deeper into the experienced phenomena that call for this usage. Thus, if ousia ordinarily means "a being that is there for me … in such a way that I can use it, that it is at my disposal", this suggests that "from the outset being, for the Greeks, means being there". We must then inquire more profoundly into this experience: "what does there mean?" (19).

As this passage illustrates, Heidegger trades on the root meaning of the word Dasein in these lectures. Instead of leaving the word untranslated, as is usual, the translators have appropriately rendered it as “being-there” (xii). Heidegger’s use of Dasein here is closer to its normal German usage, which is much like that of the English “existence”, than to the narrower sense that he will give it in Being and Time and later writings (roughly, the way of being that characterizes human beings). Heidegger’s readings of Aristotle explore the “there” in which all beings, not only human beings, appear.

However, since beings appear to human beings, Heidegger focuses on Aristotle’s understanding of human life in the Nicomachean Ethics, Politics, and Rhetoric. It is quite in keeping with Heidegger’s opposition to disengaged theorizing that he does not found his interpretations on the Organon, or deal with human beings only as special cases of beings as such. Logic and metaphysics need to be rooted in the experience of people who know their “way around” a particular world (25). Since our being is being-in-a-world, to understand ourselves is to understand how we are open to other beings (157). Thus human poiesis and praxis, not “the ontology of nature”, provide us with the foundation of the Greek concept of being (222). This argument is later mirrored in Being and Time, where Heidegger argues that all ontology needs to be grounded in a “fundamental ontology” that explicates our own way of being (SZ 13).5

In Heidegger’s view, Aristotle’s accounts of human affairs suggest a number of features of human being that readers of Being and Time will recognize.6 In the Nicomachean Ethics, "Life is (1) a way of being characterized by its being-in-a-world and (2) a being for whom, in its being as such, this very being is a question" (31). Such a being must seize a particular situation in “the moment” (123). In the Politics, human beings "are, as such, through being-with-others" (33). In the Rhetoric, human being is disclosed as "finding-oneself in the mode of being-in-a-disposition-and-bringing-oneself-therein" (38). (Here “disposition” translates Befindlichkeit, rendered unhappily as “state-of-mind” in Macquarrie and Robinson’s version of Being and Time and more successfully as “attunement” in Stambaugh’s version.) When we attend to Aristotle’s discussions of logos, we can discover “fore-having”, “fore-sight”, and “fore-grasp” as characteristics of how we interpret the there (186-7, 241-2; these passages are actually clearer than the concise account in SZ 150).

Heidegger’s interpretations of Aristotle’s Rhetoric are unique to this text and have attracted particular interest.7 Being and Time tersely remarks that the Rhetoric is a hermeneutic of everyday being-with, including the passions (SZ 138), and refers to Aristotle’s analysis of fear (SZ 140n6, 342n6). The present text fleshes out these references. As an ontology of speech and persuasion, the Rhetoric is "the hermeneutic of [human] being-there itself" -for the Greeks were "in love with logos" and speech pervaded their existence (75, 176). This love too often took the form of “babble”, but Plato and Aristotle purified talk into rigorous discourse (74). Heidegger praises them for developing "a new possibility of existence [not] from just anywhere, such as from India and thus from the outside, but rather from out of Greek living itself. They were serious about the possibility of speaking" (75). Philosophical knowledge thus grows on the soil of everyday conversation and doxa: opinion, or "that which shows itself initially is the basis of the investigation of the matter itself" (103). The Rhetoric, then, gives us an insight into the foundations of science and philosophy in actual speech. Such speech relies on affects, so Heidegger takes this opportunity to explore the ontology of pathos: human beings are always embodied and attuned in a particular way, such that they can be touched by relevant words and events in the world. They always exist in such a way that they have a sense of “how it’s going”; this “finding-oneself [makes] it possible to speak about things” (cf. 164; 176). Aristotle’s analysis of fear is an exemplary study of the disclosive power of disposition (167-176). Heidegger even suggests that Aristotle anticipates existential Angst: Aristotle recognizes the phenomenon of fear of nothingness, which is a clue to the Greek sense of being as presence (129). Similarly, fear of disappearance implies a sense of being as constancy (196, 201).

Having established some fundamental features of the Greek experience of human being-there, Heidegger devotes the last part of his course to a crucial Aristotelian concept that is rooted in this experience: movement. The concept of kinesis develops “the implicit experience of the being-there of the world and of living” into an explicit understanding of “the how of the being-there of beings” in their reciprocal co-presence (266).

Throughout these interpretations, Heidegger admires Aristotle’s empiricism (see 217 on epagoge). Against Platonic speculation, "Aristotle says: I must have ground under my feet, a ground that is there in an immediate self-evidence" (27). “That Aristotle became a phenomenologist was exactly what Heidegger accomplished and was quite the exception” in the German academy of the time.8 But Heidegger adds an interesting twist: Husserlian phenomenology may in turn be Greek, and in a way that is insufficiently reflective. When one speaks of “intuition of essence”, “one must be clear as to whether or not one wants to exhibit beings with the same sense of being meant by the Greeks” - and one must keep in mind that the “Greek being-concept did not fall from the sky, but had its definite ground” (29).

What is this being-concept? Heidegger’s investigations intend to reveal the various dimensions of the Greek understanding of being as presence: being as completion, as "having-come-into-the-there … through pro-duction", and as “being-always” (26, 147; 144; 77). Even absence, in Greek experience, is a kind of presence (62, 202, 210). This sense of being as presence needs to be both retrieved and critiqued; the critique is the larger, usually silent context for these lectures. In Being and Time, Heidegger will argue that our encounter with present beings is made possible by our temporality, which cannot itself be understood in terms of presence (SZ 25-6). (For hints of this argument in the lecture course, see 211-12, 256.) The Greek concept of being as presence thus needs to be transcended; to this end, Heidegger will eventually come to hope for a convulsion in Western history, a revolutionary new beginning. In these 1924 lectures, however, he finds abundant clues to the temporality of human being-in-the-world in Aristotle’s writings. Aristotle himself thus provides the ingredients for a richer ontology than is explicitly presented in his metaphysics. Perhaps, then, as Heidegger concludes, “What counts is not to say something new, but to say what the ancients already intended” (222).

Now a few criticisms of this translation are in order. For the most part, Robert D. Metcalf and Mark B. Tanzer have accurately conveyed the complexities of this challenging text, and it is certainly desirable to have the book available in English. It must be said, however, that one more round of revision was called for before this generally impressive translation went to press. In addition to small typographical errors, there are a variety of larger problems to which readers should be alerted.

First, editor Mark Michalski gets rough treatment. He is named only in small print on the copyright page, and the "Editors’ [sic] Afterword" inexplicably omits text from pages 413-417 and 418 of the German edition. This last page contains Michalski’s acknowledgments, and the earlier pages provide valuable information about his editorial practices. The editor has corrected grammatical errors in the text, has put quotation marks around Heidegger’s translations of Aristotle (although it is often difficult to distinguish translation from paraphrase), has added brackets around what he takes to be Heidegger’s commentary within these translations, and has favored one student transcript over another in particular cases. All these choices seem legitimate, but readers need access to the editor’s explanations of them.

The footnotes are insufficiently Englished. Two notes are simply left in untranslated German (200n35, 216n106). In other notes, readers will soon figure out that page numbers refer to the German pagination, but they may not know the meaning of “a. a. O.” (am angegebenen Ort, or “ibid.”), “S.” (Seite, page), or “Hs.” (Handschrift, i.e. the portion of this text that publishes Heidegger’s handwritten lecture notes).

The translators have chosen some questionable renditions of key terms. For example, “theoretical negotiating” translates theoretisches Verhandeln — that is, a way of handling an issue from a theoretical point of view, which has nothing to do with the sense of Verhandlung as bargaining (103). Sachlichkeit is translated as “matter-of-factness” or “concreteness” (82). Even though Heidegger uses the term Sachlichkeit in proximity to Konkretion (also translated as “concreteness”, 232), the connection to Sache should not be lost; perhaps the best solution is a phrase such as “fidelity to the things themselves”.9

Finally, when a passage seems particularly baffling, it is unfortunately often the case that the confusion is due to a mistranslation. For example, “ability-not-to-approach the phenomenon of movement” should be "inability to approach [Nichtherankommenkönnen] the phenomenon of movement" (215). Again, "the being-there-with as such, which moves" should read "the being-there-with of the sort of thing that moves [eines solchen, das bewegt]" (221). The text includes quite a few of these little blunders and awkward moments.

However, these flaws are not fatal, and readers who do not know German are still bound to profit from this important volume. A final caveat: some familiarity with Greek is almost indispensable.

1 See Phenomenological Interpretations of Aristotle: Initiation into Phenomenological Research (1921-22), trans. Richard Rojcewicz (Indiana UP, 2008); Phänomenologische Interpretationen ausgewählter Abhandlungen des Aristoteles zu Ontologie und Logik (1922), Gesamtausgabe vol. 62 (Klostermann, 2005); “Phenomenological Interpretations in Connection with Aristotle: An Indication of the Hermeneutical Situation” (1922), trans. John van Buren, in Supplements: From the Earliest Essays to “Being and Time” and Beyond, ed. John van Buren (SUNY, 2002); Plato’s “Sophist” (1924-25), trans. Richard Rojcewicz and André Schuwer (Indiana UP, 1997). This last volume includes an extensive preliminary commentary on the intellectual virtues or modes of unconcealing (aletheuein), as presented in Nicomachean Ethics VI.

2 Cited as a “proven anecdote”, with reference to Aristotle alone, by Hannah Arendt in “Martin Heidegger at Eighty”, in Heidegger and Modern Philosophy, ed. Michael Murray (Yale, 1978), 297. Thanks to Arendt’s account, the line has become one of Heidegger’s most repeated.

3 Arendt, “Martin Heidegger at Eighty”, 294.

4 See Richard Wolin, Heidegger’s Children: Hannah Arendt, Karl Löwith, Hans Jonas, and Herbert Marcuse (Princeton, 2001); Heidegger’s Jewish Followers: Essays on Hannah Arendt, Leo Strauss, Hans Jonas, and Emmanuel Levinas, ed. Samuel Fleischacker (Duquesne, 2008).

5 “SZ” will refer to Martin Heidegger, Sein und Zeit, 16th ed. (Niemeyer, 1986). The pagination of later editions such as this one is reproduced in the margins of both English translations of Being and Time.

6 It is no accident that in 1924 Heidegger was also composing a first draft of what was to become Being and Time: Der Begriff der Zeit, Gesamtausgabe vol. 64 (Klostermann, 2004).

7 See the anthology Heidegger and Rhetoric, ed. Daniel M. Gross and Ansgar Kemmann (SUNY, 2005), which provides valuable perspectives on the lecture course under review.

8 Hans-Georg Gadamer, “Heidegger as Rhetor”, in Gross and Kemmann, Heidegger and Rhetoric, 50.

9 On the importance of Sachlichkeit in Heidegger’s next lecture course, see Richard Polt, "Heidegger’s Topical Hermeneutics: The Sophist Lectures", in Heidegger Reexamined, vol. 1: Dasein, Authenticity, and Death, ed. Hubert L. Dreyfus and Mark Wrathall (Routledge, 2002).