Basic Structures of Reality: Essays in Meta-Physics

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Colin McGinn, Basic Structures of Reality: Essays in Meta-Physics, Oxford University Press, 2011, 243pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199841103.

Reviewed by Stephen Leeds, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


Colin McGinn's Basic Structures of Reality is a set of loosely connected, previously unpublished essays on, as McGinn tells us in the preface, questions 'at the intersection of physics, ontology, epistemology, and the philosophy of mind.' McGinn goes on to say that the book does not "subject physics to a metaphysical critique. Rather it seeks to articulate the philosophical content of physics: what it presupposes, its distinctive mode of theorizing, the kind of knowledge it generates, and its wider significance." This characterization, to the extent it suggests that McGinn is merely out to explicate what it is that the physicists are up to, from a standpoint they themselves might find congenial, seems to this reviewer to be quite misleading. The book is a critique of physics, from a standpoint -- metaphysical and epistemological -- far from that of most physicists or even philosophers of physics.

The first chapter finds a difficulty in the idea that matter should occupy space: that is, that at a particular location in space there should be both a point of space and a bit of matter. McGinn finds no such difficulty with the idea that the electromagnetic field should take on particular component or tensor values at points in space; part of his reason for thus drawing a distinction between fields and matter is that 'we don't think of fields as existing independently of objects'; another is that McGinn sees as central to the notion of matter the idea that the presence of matter excludes other matter, in a way in which the presence of a field value does not. He wants to see this property of impenetrability as something closer to an essential feature of matter itself, rather than of the forces with which matter is surrounded. The view he comes up with is that where matter is, there is no space. Matter destroys space: the reason another billiard ball cannot interpenetrate this one is that there is simply no space there for it to enter.

The whole picture is an attractively symmetrical one in which there are two sorts of extended entity -- space, which is absolutely receptive, and matter, which is absolutely exclusive. I think the discussion ought to have connected more explicitly with the thought, familiar at least since Boscovich, that any conception of matter as impenetrable needs to suppose any piece of matter as surrounded by forces, not to explain why other matter cannot penetrate, but to explain what happens when other matter approaches -- how fast it is turned back. (Of course, given the surrounding forces, one hardly needs the matter at all: this is in fact the position later physicists misread into Boscovich.) McGinn finally takes on something like this view in a postscript -- without I think sufficiently acknowledging the implication that we have never actually witnessed a single phenomenon arising from the impenetrability of matter.  But rejects the view on the grounds that if one electron were somehow to break though the field of repulsive force surrounding another (does McGinn overlook that these forces are generally thought to grow infinite as one approaches the center?), we could not know how many electrons were there. A propos electrons, later editions should correct the statement that in quantum mechanics two particles cannot have identical spatial wave functions.

Chapter 2 repeats at some length the familiar view that we have no conception of what matter is, as opposed to what properties it has, and how it behaves.

Chapter 3 is about absolute and relative motion. McGinn argues that the claim that bodies move relative to positions in absolute space is unclear. The standards of clarity invoked here have a distinctly Early Modern flavor: we are asked to imagine a body moving in absolute space, and it is claimed that if we think we have succeeded, we are cheating by smuggling in imagined boundaries or other bodies relative to which it is moving. He considers the idea that a body's motion can only be understood relative to a frame of reference likewise unclear. The argument for this is notable for making no mention of spacetime. McGinn is of course within his rights not to assume at the outset that current views are correct, but if one is attacking the relativity of motion as incoherent, one really ought at least to make mention of the conceptual framework that most people have in mind when they refer to such relativity. Similarly, to unveil obscurities in the idea that the speed of light is constant for any inertial observer, while refusing to take on board the relativistic spacetime framework that makes such satisfactory sense of this, is to fight with shadows. If McGinn thinks spacetime is problematic, he ought to have said why; indeed, he must be thinking it is very problematic indeed, since he prefers the rather desperate view that the constancy of the speed of light relative to any (inertial) observer is only apparent, produced by some kind of measurement interaction.

Chapter 4 puts forward the view that all change is or supervenes on changes of place. (The spin-precession of an electron in a magnetic field seems to be a counterexample.) McGinn suggests the view is a priori.

Chapter 5 is about the Law of Inertia, which McGinn sees as a consequence of a more general a priori principle to the effect that everything keeps its intrinsic properties unless interfered with. McGinn quite reasonably asks why it is not acceleration that a body persists in unless acted upon; his answer is that acceleration involves a real change, namely in speed and/or direction. I do not think the idea that change in velocity is in some sense a 'real' change is entirely hopeless; the only way I know of to make much sense of it, though, involves spacetime.

Chapter 6 is about the relation between inertial and gravitational mass. McGinn proposes that the quantity of 'motion' in a system of gravitating bodies is constant. Momentum seems not to be what's meant by 'motion', since the Third Law plays no role in the derivation. The argument depends on bodies at fixed distances swapping mass; it is true that under these conditions the sum of accelerations is unchanged (though of course not if the bodies are then allowed to move freely); however, McGinn defines 'motion' as dependent on distance and velocity, so I am not sure that this is what is meant either.

Chapter 7 bears the title 'Electric Charge: A Case Study.' McGinn guides the reader through the opening pages of a standard textbook account of electric charge. The overall point seems to be to emphasize how little we know about these matters. McGinn presses the point, which we have seen before in these pages, that a theory about how electric charge behaves can never tell us what electric charge really is. Perhaps so, though this reader frequently found himself wondering whether our inability to have what McGinn calls 'intimate' knowledge of anything outside of mentality and meaning quite comes to saying that there is something about, e.g., charge that we don't know, as opposed to a limitation on the ways we can get to know about it. But even supposing McGinn is right about this, he presents us with a false dilemma, I think, in suggesting that "the term 'charge' is either shorthand for the observed motions of (so-called) electromagnetic interactions, in which case it adds nothing explanatory, or else it refers to a 'we-know-not-what' that genuinely would explain those motions (if we only knew it)."

Suppose we grant McGinn that, not being acquainted in the Russellian sense with charge, we do not know what it really is; why cannot electromagnetism nonetheless explain why things move as they do by postulating, among other things, the existence of a magnitude we call charge? So long as electromagnetism is true, the explanation would seem to be a good one, just as telling me that someone stole my wallet can be a good explanation of why it is missing, even if I don't know who the thief was. I might mention that McGinn knows all this, and even is inclined to think we should postulate charges as properties of bodies rather than accepting the first horn of his dilemma; still, his conclusion is that postulating charge is just 'hand-waving'.

The chapter also contains some remarks about charges and fields; McGinn, who apparently thinks that all electromagnetic fields arise from charges (classical electrodynamics is consistent with this idea, although it does not entail it, and I think few people believe it), wonders why we don't simply say that 'having the charge is identical to the field.' He leans towards the view that fields are real, but complains that we have little understanding of the 'ontological standing' of either charges or fields. The entire discussion is imbued with a sense that the physicists have not done their job:

In fact, I think that the physicists simply observed certain kinds of interactions, decided to call them "electrical," postulated an attribute they labeled "charge," brought in associated "fields," and then proceeded to work out the laws that govern those interactions; what exactly all these terms denote was left completely unsettled. (138)

I must admit that I don't understand this, or similar passages. McGinn is surely not complaining that the physicists neglected to acquire knowledge by acquaintance of charges: he thinks such knowledge is quite likely impossible. The complaint seems rather to be that the physicists have neglected to clarify and argue for the ontology they've adopted. But, really, can McGinn be unaware that just the opposite is true? The ontological standing of fields and charges, as they appear in classical electromagnetism, is entirely clear: charge, for example, is a magnitude -- a family of properties of particles which carries a natural metrical structure; fields are families of properties of space with a rather more complex structure. The theory may of course be utterly false, but one cannot claim that the brilliant -- and philosophically sophisticated -- physicists who fought for field theory against the equally brilliant and philosophically sophisticated supporters of action at a distance failed to give arguments, both empirical and metaphysical. Of course one is unlikely to find their arguments in an introductory physics text.

Chapter 8 lays out in detail the view mentioned above about intimate and remote knowledge. I was surprised to find that we have intimate knowledge of meanings; I imagine there are Burgean objections to this, but I assume McGinn has long since dealt with these.

Chapter 9 is about energy. McGinn argues interestingly that "energy is a single homogenous thing that takes up residence in different material forms." His argument for this depends largely on rejecting a 'functional' account of energy.  This is an account that sees the energy of a system as a function of the state variables, the appropriate function being determined in the case of any particular kind of system as the one which plays a certain role in the behavior of that system or its interactions with other systems (more abstractly, one which has a certain second-order property). McGinn's objection to the version of the functional account he considers -- namely, energy as the capacity to do work -- is to imagine possible worlds in which all behavior is as in our world, but there is no energy in the moving billiard ball, only a disposition to move on the part of the ball it collides into. This seems to me to depend too much on intuitions about where the energy is located, intuitions that at least in my case are shaken by considering that it is surely a matter of frame of reference which billiard ball is carrying the kinetic energy; also that the potential energy between two attracting bodies doesn't seem well-located in either. Perhaps tying the notion of energy as closely as McGinn does to the capacity to do work gives these 'intuitions' about location a little more cachet than they deserve; the equally familiar conception of energy as the generator of dynamics doesn't encourage one to ask which body has the energy -- of course McGinn might say for just that reason that it is clearly wrong.

McGinn goes on to argue in favor of his own conception that if we assume energy is a stuff, we can explain why it is conserved over time. It seems to me, however, that if one wants to explain the details of how energy is conserved -- how the kinetic energy gets shared when the balls collide -- then one must sooner or later set out the dynamics, in which case one gets conservation of energy for free -- at least under the generator of dynamics conception.

Chapter 10 argues that consciousness is itself a form of matter, i.e., that just as there is no useful sense in which the electromagnetic field is less a material entity than a lump of coal -- the genus matter takes various forms, of which some are solid, others not -- so one form of matter may be what we call consciousness. There are so many ways one can be antireductionist about consciousness while yet in some sense continuing to believe that atoms and the void are all there is, that I would have liked to see McGinn declare for or against the following claim: that adding up all the usual carriers of energy in my brain will not quite equal the sum of all the energy that entered my body through the usual sources or all that I will bequeath to the world after my death, the excess being the energy that exists in my consciousness. Such a view was defended by Wilbur Hart some years back (though Hart considered himself a dualist); without it I am not sure that it is possible to think of consciousness as ontologically independent of everything else as I sense McGinn wants it to be. Against such a view it would be churlish to complain that there is no evidence for it: who has measured all the atoms in a brain? More telling as an objection, perhaps, is the difficulty of telling the story in detail: how much kinetic energy does an atom lose by becoming part of my brain?

Chapter 11 is an extended and I think rather strained comparison between the recent history of physics and the study of meaning in philosophy: as inert matter has been replaced by energy (is this indeed the case?), so the dynamical view of meaning of the later Wittgenstein replaced a static Fregean view of words endowed with senses. Acknowledging that the analogies are somewhat metaphorical, McGinn insists that nonetheless they are historically significant: the physics guided the theory of meaning.

The very short Part Two is a series of numbered remarks, mostly about the status of laws in the world. The general idea is to see them as immanent, real, part of the fabric of the world. All very metaphorical, but perhaps it is only by trying to state these metaphors clearly that we will eventually win our way to a more satisfactory view of laws than we have at present. So McGinn thinks, and this reader agrees.