Baumgarten and Kant on Metaphysics

Placeholder book cover

Courtney D. Fugate and John Hymers (eds.), Baumgarten and Kant on Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2018, 235pp., $65.00, ISBN 9780198783886.

Reviewed by Oliver Thorndike, Loyola University Maryland, Baltimore


This book brings together eleven essays on Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten's Metaphysica. Understanding the influence of Baumgarten's philosophical thought on Kant (who adopted Baumgarten's textbooks for his lectures), but also comprehending Baumgarten's thinking in its own right within the broader Leibnizian-Wolffian framework, has drawn growing attention in recent scholarship. Yet a systematic study of Baumgarten's notoriously difficult Metaphysica has remained a desideratum, and so this very welcome volume provides much needed guidance.

In their introduction, the editors, Courtney D. Fugate and John Hymers, express the hope that this collection will go some distance toward providing a commentary on Baumgarten's Metaphysica which Baumgarten himself might have envisioned but never wrote. (6) The volume "aims to provide an anchor" (7) for the emerging discussion on Baumgarten, whose Metaphysica has recently become accessible to a broad English-speaking audience through a translation by Fugate and Hymers. Accordingly, the volume gives detailed analyses of key terminology, which it traces and compares to a broad spectrum of philosophers including Descartes, Leibniz, Wolff, Kant, Maimon and Hegel. While some of the contributors look at Baumgarten's Metaphysica through an external lens, (e.g., Descartes' conception of psychology, Kant's refutation of idealism, Kant's thoughts on the omnitudo realitatis in the Opus postumum), most simply focus on a specific section of Baumgarten's Metaphysica. Thus, the volume can be said to provide a very useful commentary on all of the four sections of Baumgarten's textbook: Part 1: Ontology, Part 2: Cosmology, Part 3: Psychology, and Part 4: Natural Theology.

One central question that occupies a number of the essays concerns whether Baumgarten can be conceived as a mediator between Wolff's rationalism and the Pietists. Both Brandon C. Look's "Baumgarten's Rationalism" and Clemens Schwaiger's "Baumgarten's Theory of Freedom: A Contribution to the Wolff-Lange Controversy" (previously published in German and here translated into English) open new perspectives on this question. The thesis that Baumgarten is not a typical rationalist, but more of a mediating figure, stands in contrast to the traditional reading that simply aligns Baumgarten with Wolff.

Wolff's rationalism hinges on the principle of sufficient reason: In the natural world, nothing is above reason, and everything is explicable with reference to the principle of sufficient reason. (19) Look shows how Baumgarten maintains a commitment to rationalism (i.e., the universality of the principle of sufficient reason and the intelligibility of the world) while rejecting the pull of naturalism and atheism, of which the Pietists accused Wolff's philosophy. Look examines Baumgarten's definitions of philosophy and metaphysics, juxtaposes these with those of Leibniz and Wolff, and notes that Baumgarten's definitions put special emphasis on the knowing subject: "Metaphysics . . . concerns the nature of human knowledge and, presumably, its limits." (14) The reader will feel invited here to reflect on Baumgarten's position in the history of philosophy with regard to Descartes, Locke, and Kant. Baumgarten's quite Lockean sounding conception of philosophy is subsequently used to show how Baumgarten distances himself from the Pietist charge by seeking to unify divine providence with rationalism. Human cognition is limited and "neither revelation . . . nor holy faith . . . go against reason." (22) While Look's characterization of Baumgarten as the "rational Pietist" focuses on passages taken from the Ontology and Natural Theology parts of the Metaphysica, Schwaiger makes a similar point by analyzing the Psychology section.

Schwaiger argues that Baumgarten has a key role in mediating between Wolff and the Pietists, and its key issue of the conceivability of freedom. (43) Schwaiger, the only contributor who already has published extensively on Baumgarten, shows how Baumgarten revises Wolff's theory of freedom by assigning a new role to intuitive knowledge for moral agency. Unlike a purely rationalist conception of agency along the lines of Descartes, where a clear and distinct perception of the good is taken as motivationally sufficient to pursue what is perceived as good by the intellect, Baumgarten emphasizes that only intuitive knowledge moves to action. (47) Herein lies an "echo of the Pietist ideal of a call to action by awakening from religious-moral indifference." (48) It introduces a decisively empirical element into Baumgarten's theory of freedom, which Kant further develops in his Anthropology lectures.

Whether Baumgarten succeeds in establishing a more robust notion of freedom vis-à-vis Wolff's psychological determinism remains to be seen. Schwaiger sees in Baumgarten's terminological nuances the "fundamental concern" of "protecting the idea of freedom . . . against the suspicion of an underlying prevailing determinism." (55) However, it seems that it is not until Kant separates moral agency from any empirical motivating grounds that Baumgarten's project of distancing himself from determinism succeeds. Further, Kant's separation of morality from empirical motivating grounds is a move against Baumgarten. One of Schwaiger's main points is to emphasize that a mere thought does not motivate a person to act, and that in order to bring a thought to life we need anthropology (examples, experiences, etc.), i.e., intuitive knowledge of the good. But anthropology, qua being empirical, does not get us away from empirical determinism.

While Schwaiger likes to highlight aspects of Baumgarten's philosophy that are in continuity with or a bridge to Kant's critical philosophy, other contributors tend to emphasize more the differences between Kant and Baumgarten. Perhaps Baumgarten's historically decisive role in the debate should more conservatively be seen in the simple fact that he provides the vocabulary for much of Kant's philosophical inquiries. Henry E. Allison's "Freedom of the Will in Baumgarten and Kant's ML1," for example, analyzes Baumgarten's terminology in both the empirical and rational psychology sections of the Metaphysica. Based on this analysis, Allison presents an imagined conversation (that is both highly entertaining and philosophically effective) between a student who attended Kant's lecture and has studied Baumgarten's textbook and his professor Kant, in order to clarify the central issues separating Kant's (transcendental) conception of freedom from the more empirically minded freedom of choice found in the Metaphysica.

One of the volume's major contributions is that all the essays advance the project of analyzing key terminology of the Metaphysica. Thus, Corey W. Dyck's "Between Wolffianism and Pietism: Baumgarten's Rational Psychology" continues Schwaiger's project of pointing out nuanced terminological differences between Wolff and Baumgarten. Dyck argues that Baumgarten presents a "distinctive rational psychology which blends both Wolffian and Pietistic influences in its attempt to understand the human soul, its relation to the body, and its condition in the afterlife." (79) One worry of the Pietists is that Wolff seems to see the essence of the soul as representing things from the position of the body, i.e., through sensibility. The question becomes whether this fundamental role of the faculty of representation thus conceived does not take the soul's nature to consist in its lowest cognitive function, and how the higher cognitive functions required for rational willing and contemplating spiritual beings can be seen to be consistently grounded in the former. (81-2) By reconstructing the historical debate and analyzing Baumgarten's "subtle revisions" of Wolff's account (88), Dyck throws new light on understanding how Baumgarten attempts to address such worries.

Four more essays focus on "a number of subtle but nonetheless important" (93) terminological departures from Wolff in Baumgarten's Metaphysica. These essays present a detailed conceptual analysis of some of Baumgarten's key terminology with its subsequent application to central questions in the history of philosophy. For example, Angelica Nuzzo's "Determination, Determinability, and the Structure of Ens: Baumgarten's Ontology and Beyond," provides an analysis of Baumgarten's concept of "determinatio" and subsequently shows how the Metaphysica remains influential for Maimon and Hegel. Hereby, Nuzzo wants to correct a historiographical mistake: "while Baumgarten's presence is acknowledged with regard to Kant . . . his contribution is completely erased in the aftermath of the critical philosophy." (23)

In a similar vein, Rudolf A. Makkreel's "Baumgarten and Kant on Clarity, Distinctness, and the Differentiation of our Mental Powers," focuses on some terminology from the empirical Psychology section of the Metaphysica, for example, "intensive and extensive clarity," "reflection," "comparison," and "logical distinctness." Makkreel subsequently shows how Kant picks up this terminology in his lectures, and uses it with respect to his own theory of imagination. The role of reflective judgment and productive imagination in Kant's epistemology, aesthetics, and moral philosophy are highly debated issues in contemporary Kant scholarship. Thus, the reader will gain a much richer background on Kant's terminological choices that, in turn, will be very fruitful for these central Kantian debates.

Two essays stand out with respect to their originality. Each attempts to defend Baumgarten against some of the charges Kant had brought against him: Hymers' "Contradiction and Privation: Baumgarten and Kant on the Concept of Nothing," and Fugate's "Baumgarten and Kant on Existence." Hymers provides an analysis of Baumgarten's formulation of the principle of contradiction and its relation to the terms "something," "nothing," "possible," and "impossible." For Baumgarten, the principle of contradiction is the first principle of all ontology: "something" is that which contradicts contradiction (i.e., nothing). This is the starting point of metaphysics for Baumgarten, as it were. (120) Kant objects to this position that the distinction between something and nothing still presupposes the higher concept of a "an object in general." (Critique of Pure Reason, A290) He alleges that Baumgarten confuses the logical and metaphysical senses of "something." Famously, Kant says that I can think whatever I like as long as I don't contradict myself, but that this does not yet amount to "something" unless the thought attains objective reality. (Critique of Pure Reason, Bxxvi) Hymers' discussion of this culminates in a reconstruction of Kant's quadripartite table of "nothing' (Critique of Pure Reason, A292), and its relation to Baumgarten. Hymers concludes that it is not evident that Kant's categorical ordering of "nothing" can be consistently subsumed under "object in general" (130), and thus it remains debatable whether Kant provides a coherent alternative to Baumgarten's conception of "nothing." Fugate's essay is equally original. He shows how, for Baumgarten, "existence" is not identical with "actuality" and how a clearer view of this distinction helps to clarify that some of Kant's "supposedly disqualifying criticisms" (153) leveled against Baumgarten and the ontological argument (criticisms that have been accepted all too quickly by subsequent commentators) are in fact groundless. (150-153) It is this kind of detailed terminological work that makes this volume so valuable and that both highlights the originality of Baumgarten and makes us see Kant's philosophy in a new light.

Jeffrey Edwards' "Wolff, Baumgarten, and the Principle of Thoroughgoing Determination in Kant's Opus postumum" ties back into Hymers' and Fugate's analyses of "existence" and "possibility." Edwards focuses on how Baumgarten and Kant understand the principle of thoroughgoing determination. Much of Kant's late fascicles in the Opus postumum reconnect with pre-critical material, and so Edwards' analysis of Baumgarten's unique formulations in the Metaphysica provide a rich background for anyone interested in Kant's late philosophy. Even though Edwards' interest lies clearly in the Opus postumum (and not Baumgarten), such an external lens on Baumgarten can help to clarify the role of Baumgarten within the history of philosophy. In a similar vein, Paul Guyer ("Baumgarten, Kant, and the Refutation of Idealism") focuses on Kant's struggle with this aspect of his transcendental idealism. Guyer's analysis of Baumgarten's definition of "idealism" gives the reader a richer understanding of what Kant thinks a refutation of idealism needs to refute. (154)

Finally, Gary Hatfield ("Baumgarten, Wolff, Descartes, and Origins of Psychology") also focuses an external lens on Baumgarten insofar as he seems mostly to be motivated by an interest in Descartes. For example, the reader learns that, contrary to what is commonly believed, Descartes has a theory about how material processes cause mental states. (74) Nevertheless, in the wake of discussing Descartes, Hatfield also highlights two different approaches to psychology that are rooted in different aims. On the one hand, Wolff and Baumgarten investigate the cognitive and appetitive faculties with normative interests in mind (e.g., what facilitates and impedes the proper function of the cognitive and appetitive faculties) (69), but Descartes is interested in the natural philosophy of human and animal behavior (the latter being absent in Baumgarten's Metaphysica). (76) And while Wolff's and Baumgarten's methods hinge on introspection of the mental, Descartes uses physiological hypotheses to explain behavioral patterns.

The volume is incredibly rich, thought provoking, and takes some big steps toward a better understanding of Baumgarten's Metaphysica and its role in the history of philosophy. The book provides tremendous service to anyone interested in Baumgarten.