Beauty and the End of Art: Wittgenstein, Plurality and Perception

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Sonia Sedivy, Beauty and the End of Art: Wittgenstein, Plurality and Perception, Bloomsbury, 2016, 256 pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781350076631.

Reviewed by Danièle Moyal-Sharrock, University of Hertfordshire


As the title and subtitle suggest, there are many themes addressed in this book, perhaps too many. Certainly, too many for me to do justice to the multifarious strands they generate. Sonia Sedivy's aim is to find a new intersection in the relationships between art, aesthetic properties, beauty, perception, Wittgensteinian realism and Kant's aesthetics. She looks for a way in which beauty might speak to a sense of ending in Western art without that implying that art is stopping, but rather that it is completely open. The book concludes with the proposal that beauty is the value of perceptual engagement, of the world's inseparable perceptible presence to us, and that this core value in human life may be reaffirmed for art.

The book has two parts of three chapters each, an introduction and a conclusion. Themes of loss and reaffirmation engage the first part as it reconstructs leading arguments about the end of art and the devaluation of beauty in the twentieth century and the revival of beauty at the turn of the twenty-first. Part 2 situates the issues thus identified in a new framework for art, perception and beauty. The framework is Wittgensteinian; the discussion of beauty is Kantian. Sedivy's focus is on visual art; she argues that beauty is perceptible, without implying it is only perceptible. Her focus is prompted by the emphasis on visual art in twentieth-century discussions of beauty and the end of art, which made two oppositions more apparent: that between historicism and essentialism, and that between the aesthetic (or perceptible) and the cognitive (or conceptual). It will be the task of Part 2 to argue that Wittgenstein's work helps dissolve the first dichotomy while conceptual realism about perception obviates the second.

Chapter 1 focuses on the question of the end of art as posed by the historian Hans Belting and the philosopher Arthur C. Danto. Both show that some form of historicism needs to enter into our understanding of art; but where Belting analyses the inadequacy of art-historical concepts for identifying contemporary artworks, Danto argues that the correct narrative template became available with the art of the 1960s, forcing on us the question of the nature of art. In reaction to the neo-Wittgensteinian denial that art is definable, Danto looks for a way to combine essentialism with historicism. He does this by embracing the historicism in Wittgenstein's later work in a way that is coherent with his own core essentialism (i.e. all artworks embody meanings). More precisely, as Sedivy explains, Danto appeals to the notion of forms of life to support the idea of 'objective historical structures' or 'closed ranges of possibilities' such that not all contents can be meaningfully entertained at all times. An obvious example: Duchamp's Fountain could not have been presented at a mid-nineteenth-century salon because Fountain's particular way of embodying its meaning would not have been available. So that art has a timeless nature that we might understand and explain (embodied meaning), but that nature requires historical realization.

I was grateful for Sedivy's fleshing out of Danto's use of 'forms of life' as objective historical structures interweaving into art-historical narratives to accommodate both essentialism and historicism. But I could not stop myself from hankering after the simpler explanation that I've been offering my students for years: thanks to Wittgenstein, Danto realised that meaning is use (context) and that Warhol's Brillo Boxes or Duchamp's Fountain could have no artistic meaning in the 19th century because the 'atmosphere of artistic theory' needed to give them such meaning, or to allow Duchamp or Danto to initiate its conditions, was not there. This is one of several occasions on which I felt Sedivy's style or content would have benefited from some simplification.

With Danto, it becomes apparent that beauty is inessential to art; but, as Sedivy rightly suggests, contemporary theories' compelling reaffirmation of beauty's integral relation to (some) art tell against that view. Before considering these theories in Chapter 3, she delineates Gadamer's view that rethinking beauty is helpful for understanding the continuity of art and that beauty is not a matter of subjective sensory pleasure but of perceptual experience that engages us with truths. But this is truth as 'disclosure' or something like pre-propositional presence, and beauty as the immediately graspable radiance of the intelligible. It is precisely because the complexity of experiencing beauty and art cannot be fully rendered in descriptive concepts that Gadamer insists that accounts of beauty and art need to draw on a theory of perception adequate for explaining them.

With this important precedent in mind, Chapter 3 explores the three themes at work in contemporary reaffirmations of beauty by Elaine Scarry, Alexander Nehamas and Dave Hickey: (1) the need to understand that beauty is a value with no transcendent backing, but rather involves a meaningful complexity that artworks make visibly manifest; (2) the question of beauty's perceptibility; (3) a reaffirmation of the persistent role of beautiful art in human life that rebuts the idea of art's ending. Here, I will only mention Nehamas's core commitment: finding something beautiful or loving it draws us to want to understand it. So that, while agreeing with Danto that beauty or aesthetics is not part of the definition of art, Nehamas insists that because beauty and the love it inspires continue to drive our intense and formative relationships with artworks, such relationships remain an ongoing dimension of human life, untouched by the trajectory of art history. Sedivy concludes the first part of her book by stressing the importance of this ongoing conversation about beauty in rethinking value and objectivity, and in reaffirming beauty as a value for art.

Chapter 4 is the first of Part 2 -- 'Art from a Wittgensteinian Perspective' -- which is the mainstay of the book. Here, Sedivy clarifies how Wittgenstein's later work enables us to realize that 'contingency and objectivity are not adversaries but bedfellows'. It does this by recognizing that it is in historically contingent practices that objective facts, norms and values become available and compelling. Wittgenstein's emphasis on the rule or norm-informed nature of human activity helps us see art as a variety of locally overlapping practices, each with their own constitutive norms, aims and values. This satisfies the intuition that there is something that makes a range of artefacts art -- an objectivism or essentialism of sorts -- while also allowing for plurality in what makes something art in different cultural eras. This less restricted notion of objectivity than implied by scientific method, along with the understanding of how contingent contextual factors impact that objectivity, are precisely what is needed to understand that beauty can play an essential role in some but not all cultures.

It is with this in mind that, in Chapter 5, Sedivy sets about looking for a more fine-grained understanding of the local practices that intertwine into what is called art and argues that, although what 'makes' something art are local norms of specific practices, there is one life activity that is shared by these art practices, and that is perceptual engagement. She claims that both the idea that art practices involve perceptual experience and the idea that perception is a mode of direct engagement with objects and properties to which our conceptual capacities are internally related, are Wittgenstein-inspired. She calls this view of perception in which mind and world 'interpenetrate' 'conceptual realism'; and endeavours to give it its Wittgensteinian flavour by showing that Wittgenstein's notion of conceptualisation -- one's understanding of what makes something the sort of thing or property it is -- does not generally consist in propositional attitudes that one must entertain, but lies in use, in what we say, do, think, see etc. (I prefer using the expression 'in action' as a more obvious marker of the difference). That John is a person is in use in one's bodily comportment towards him -- one doesn't tread on his toes, gives him the bodily respect due to a person, asks him to sign permission forms etc. With McDowell in tow, Sedivy argues that this is no less true of perception, and that the content of perceptual experience no less depends on objects and properties themselves. Like any other capacity, perceptual experience is transfigured into second nature. Criteria of correctness being extant and internalized through training into life activities makes perceptual experience a contentful, though immediate, taking as true of individuals and properties.

And here, I must part company with the author. Wittgenstein, as I read him, has no truck with any contentful conceptual realism; the enculturation that makes perceptual experience second nature does not, on his view, result in a 'taking as true' of individuals and properties but in an immediate grasp, which is not susceptible of truth (or falsity). That is, it is not first-personally engaged with truth or falsity; though these may be engaged third-personally. Though Sedivy's talk of immediacy (e.g., 'what we understand is what we can see noninferentially') would seem to side with this view, her insistence on the truth-value and contentfulness of perceptual experience shows otherwise. It also pervades her reading of On Certainty in the next chapter.

Chapter 6 builds on conceptual realism about perception to give Kant a nonmetaphysical twist. To do this, Sedivy extricates some of Kant's insights from their original transcendental context and appeals to Wittgenstein's realism to show how it is reciprocal relations between persons and world that make objective facts and values available. She finds these objective facts and values in On Certainty in the form of inalienable truths that must stand fast in order to serve as the unquestioned framework or scaffolding of cognition and perceptual engagement with the world: 'a person, a being who finds things intelligible, is one for whom some truths are immediate and inalienable'. She then suggests we transpose these -- allegedly Wittgenstein's -- claims about truth and understanding to aesthetic value and perception: 'To be an aesthetically aware person requires that there be some apprehensions of beauty -- that is, of aesthetic or perceptual value -- that are immediate and inalienable from one'. Immediate and inalienable, yes; but these 'apprehensions' -- be they aesthetic or of a more garden variety -- are not, on Wittgenstein's view, truths.

Sedivy's understanding of Wittgenstein's nonepistemic certainties as 'truths' is based on an exegetically superficial reading of what Wittgenstein comes to see are basic 'ways of acting' ('In the beginning is the deed') that can be verbally rendered without investing them with propositionality. Sedivy would have done better to attribute to Wittgenstein's notion of basic certainty the same enactive nature she attributed to his notion of conceptualisation: one's certainty manifests itself in use, in action, and not in truth-evaluable judgments. I applaud her attempt to acknowledge a shared, immediate and inalienable background or scaffolding of cognition and perceptual engagement, but that scaffolding -- be it its first- or second-nature component; be it aesthetic or not -- is not constituted of true judgments or of 'principles of judgment' that stand fast in order that we may make myriad specific and potentially varying judgments. It is precisely this absence of truth-conditionality regarding basic certainties that allows for a non-regressive, immediate, inalienable and yet shared certainty -- reminiscent of Kant's sensus communis, which, while entitling each of us to assume the concurrence of all, has no truth-saying pretensions. So, while I agree with Sedivy's attempt to extend Wittgenstein's notion of an immediate, shared background as the necessary 'objectivity' from which our various, historical conceptions of art can emerge, I don't see Wittgenstein as endorsing its contentful or epistemic nature.

Sedivy ends by suggesting that, on Kant's view, the aesthetic attributes of some paintings allow us to 'think much that cannot be said', expanding our concepts through a harmonious but free interplay of our faculties of imagination and understanding; and that although beauty eludes our understanding, in experiencing beauty, we experience the wonder of perception itself. I think there is something to this, but not enough. I would have liked to see this wonder of perception fleshed out into something less theoretical or contemplative. Something which shows how, though beauty itself eludes our understanding, it draws us to an understanding that cannot be said, or indeed thought, but that is perceived, intimated, apprehended, or recognised, and for which we are intimately and infinitely grateful.

This is nevertheless an important book: it significantly paves the way to a better understanding of objectivity in art and its logical coexistence with historicism; it reaffirms the inextinguishable presence of beauty in art and the correlated importance of perception in our engagement with, and accounts of, art; and that journey is made in the company of great thinkers. That it could have done this with at times more simplicity and brevity takes little away from the book's importance.