Because Without Cause: Non-Causal Explanations in Science and Mathematics

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Marc Lange, Because Without Cause: Non-Causal Explanations in Science and Mathematics, Oxford University Press, 2016, 489pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190269487.

Reviewed by Alexander Reutlinger, Ludwig-Maximilians-Universität München


Marc Lange provides an elaborate philosophical analysis of non-causal explanations in the (natural) sciences and in pure mathematics. According to Lange, such non-causal explanations involve a "because without cause" (p. xi) since they "do not derive their explanatory power by virtue of describing the world's network of causal relations" (p. xi). This is an original and thought-provoking contribution to the current debate on non-causal explanations in philosophy of science and philosophy of mathematics.

Because of the complexity and wealth of the case studies discussed, I will not attempt to summarize the content, chapter by chapter. Instead, I will highlight selected examples and reconstruct what I take to be the main philosophical idea: that is, to my mind, a pluralist approach to explanations in science and mathematics. Moreover, I will put an emphasis on Lange's discussion of scientific explanations. I will treat his account of explanations in pure mathematics only in passing and merely indicate how it fits into the larger pluralist framework that Lange advocates.

Lange's book is part of a larger 'movement' in current philosophy of science that draws attention to non-causal ways of explaining (for a survey of the recent debate, see Reutlinger 2017 and the introduction in Reutlinger and Saatsi forthcoming). Lange's work -- including this book and a number of papers -- is one of the driving forces and highly original voices in the debate.

To fully appreciate Lange's originality, it is useful to remind ourselves of the state of the debate on scientific explanation. For the past three decades, causal accounts have been the received view. According to causal accounts, the sciences explain if and only if they identify the causes of (and mechanisms for) the phenomenon to be explained (see, for instance, Salmon 1984, 1989; Cartwright 1989; Woodward 2003; Strevens 2008; see Andersen 2014 for an overview of causal-mechanistic theories).

It is crucial to realize that it is not Lange's project to deny or even question the significance of causal explanations in the sciences. Quite to the contrary. He explicitly and repeatedly points out that there are plenty of scientific explanations appealing to the causes of the explanandum at issue (for instance, on pp. xi, 5, 18). Lange even defends the claim that there are fewer non-causal scientific explanations than other friends of non-causal explanations believe there are. He argues that some scientific explanations are mistakenly characterized as being non-causal. For instance, Lange holds that, contrary to other voices in the debate, examples of abstract explanations (pp. xvi, 32-33), program explanations (p. 32), and equilibrium explanations (pp. 15, 24) ought to be understood as garden-variety causal scientific explanations.

However, if causal accounts are taken to specify necessary and sufficient conditions for scientific explanations (as they often are), then causal accounts face many counterexamples. Lange argues that one finds a plentitude of scientific explanations whose explanatory power does not derive from "describing the world's network of causal relations" (p. xi). Such non-causal explanations have been "largely neglected by philosophy of science" (p. xii). In other words, Lange claims there are at least two types of scientific explanation: non-causal and causal types of explanation (not everyone agrees in the current debate, see Skow 2016).

Moreover, Lange argues that there are further good reasons for abandoning causal accounts if one is interested in explanation more generally, because the sciences are not the only intellectual project striving for explanation. Lange argues that explanations in pure mathematics constitute another large class of non-causal explanations. Some paradigmatic mathematical explanations are proofs explaining why certain theorems are true (but not all mathematical explanation are proofs of theorems, as Lange claims, for instance, on pp. 233, 270, and 274). Indeed Lange (rightly) notes that "explanation in mathematics has never been among the central topics in the philosophy of mathematics" (p. xii). (Lange also provides an interesting brief discussion of further kinds of non-causal explanation that he does not discuss in detail, such as grounding explanations in metaphysics and identity explanations in the sciences, see pp. xiv-xx).

In sum, Lange holds that, if one takes seriously what scientists and mathematicians consider to be explanatory, then this gives rise to a rich 'landscape' of explanatory practices consisting of (1) causal explanations in the sciences, (2) non-causal explanations in the sciences, and (3) non-causal explanations in pure mathematics.

How does Lange think about this 'landscape' of explanatory practices philosophically? Lange favors a kind of explanatory pluralism forming his philosophical big picture. As I understand Lange's project, his discussion of a plentitude of case studies of scientific and mathematical non-causal explanations mainly serves the purpose of gathering evidence for explanatory pluralism.

Lange describes his pluralist approach in various places. For instance, he articulates it as follows:

I will not try to portray non-causal scientific explanations as working in roughly in the same way as causal scientific explanations do (except that some variety of non-causal dependence appears in place of causal dependence). I will not even try to portray all non-causal scientific explanations as working in the same way as one another. (p. xii)

I have not argued that every example of explanation in math or every example of non-causal scientific explanation falls into one of the kinds of non-causal explanations I have identified. I have also not tried to force all of the explanations into a single narrow mold. (Indeed I see no good reason to award any greater degree of plausibility to a proposed 'model' of explanation in math and science . . . just because it purports to offer the same account of all examples.) However, I have tried to group the examples that I have studied into various kinds based on how the explanations work, and I have also tried to highlight some of the affinities among these kinds of explanation. (p. 371)

I think it is fair to characterize Lange's explanatory pluralism (and explanatory pluralism more generally) as follows: as a pluralist, he holds that, first, there are different types of explanations (in particular, causal and non-causal explanations), and, second, there is no single theory of explanation covering all causal and non-causal explanations; instead one needs two (or more) distinct theories of explanation to adequately capture all causal and non-causal explanations. I believe that both of these aspects come out nicely in the two quotes above. However, although Lange is an explanatory pluralist, he stresses "the affinities among these kinds of explanations" (p. 371). Below, I will provide more information about Lange's explanatory pluralism.

Now, I will briefly contrast Lange's explanatory pluralism with two alternative reactions to the claim that there are causal and non-causal explanations (namely, particularism and monism), because I think it is helpful for understanding Lange's approach.

First, proponents of particularism accept that there are causal and non-causal explanations but particularists deny that developing a general theory of explanation is a worthwhile philosophical project. According to particularists, the explanatory strategies in the sciences (and in pure mathematics) are much too diverse to specify necessary and sufficient conditions for explanation, if that is indeed the goal of a theory of explanation. There are no interesting generalizations to be drawn from the discussion of particular case studies of explanation. Indeed, philosophers should devote their energy to detailed analyses of case studies instead of proposing high-flying general theories (such a view is articulated, for instance, in Morrison 2015: 19). The goal of particularists is perhaps best described as being therapeutic (in the sense of Wittgenstein and Rorty): their major goal is to convince more ambitious philosophers (like Lange) that general accounts of explanation cannot be had. Like the particularists, Lange is certainly not opposed to detailed case studies (as any reader will soon realize and appreciate). Moreover, Lange does not believe that there is one single general, overarching theory of explanation capturing all of the examples he is interested in. However, in contrast to the particularists, Lange does believe that it is possible to make interesting general claims about certain classes or "groups" of non-causal explanations.

Second, monism is the view that there is one single philosophical account capturing both causal and non-causal explanations. A monist holds that causal and non-causal explanations share a feature that makes them explanatory. In the current literature, different brands of monism are being discussed, including counterfactual theories and the extended kairetic account (see Reutlinger 2017: section 3.3 for an overview). However, Lange rejects monism. In fact, he repeatedly emphasizes that he has no ambition to develop a single general theory of causal and non-causal explanation (see the quotes above).

In sum, Lange argues for a pluralist middle ground between particularism and monism. Lange takes, so to speak, the best of both worlds. He adopts the particularists' cautious and skeptical attitude toward a single general theory of explanation (guarding against unwarranted over-generalizations from a small stock of examples). But Lange agrees, to a certain degree, with the monist spirit that one should try to achieve maximally informative and general claims about certain classes or groups of explanations that clearly extend beyond a particular case study -- and to identify "affinities" between these classes or groups.

Let me now provide a more detailed reconstruction of Lange's explanatory pluralism.  In Part I (Chapters 1-4), he analyzes the first 'group' of non-causal explanations in science: scientific explanations by constraint. Lange argues that such non-causal explanations operate by showing that certain facts constrain the explanandum phenomenon in question. Lange presents various examples of explanations by constraint.

In Chapter 1, Lange illustrates the nature of explanatory constraints by drawing on "distinctively mathematical" explanations, a subspecies of explanations by constraint. I will primarily focus on distinctively mathematical explanation to convey Lange's more general notion of an explanation by constraint. Let me pick out two of his many examples of distinctively mathematical explanations.

First, "That Mother has 3 children and 23 strawberries, and that 23 cannot be divided evenly by 3, explains why Mother failed when she tried a moment ago to distribute her strawberries evenly among her children without cutting any." (p. 6) Lange holds that in this case the explanatory power comes from the mathematical fact "that 23 cannot be divided evenly by 3" (p. 6).

Second, "why has no one ever succeeded . . . in crossing all of the bridges of Königsberg exactly once . . .?" (p. 7) Lange argues that the answer to this why-question is distinctively mathematical. In this answer, Lange supposes that one represents the bridges of Königsberg by using a network consisting of vertices (corresponding to the parts of Königsberg) and edges (representing the bridges connecting the parts of Königsberg):

in the bridge arrangement considered as a network, it is not the case that either every vertex or every vertex but two is touched by an even number of edges. . . . Any successful bridge-crosser would have to enter a given vertex exactly as many times as she leaves it unless that vertex is the start or the end of her trip. So among the vertices, either none (if the trip starts and ends at the same vertex) or two could touch an odd number of edges. Intuitively, this explanation is distinctively mathematical. (pp. 7-8)

Once more, Lange claims that the explanatory power is derived from a piece of mathematics: that is, certain formal properties of networks (stated by Euler's theorem).

In addition to these two distinctively mathematical explanations, Lange discusses an impressive number of further cases including both toy examples (such as the trefoil knot, pp. 8-9) and more sophisticated examples such as a topological explanation of why a double pendulum has four equilibrium configurations (pp. 26-28). But what do these examples have in common that allows Lange to group them together? He says:

Ultimately, I will argue that . . . these explanations explain not by describing the world's causal structure, but rather by revealing that the explanandum is necessary -- in particular, more necessary than ordinary laws of nature are. (p. 9)

[A distinctively mathematical explanation, A.R.] exploits what the world is like as a matter of mathematical necessity . . . . (p. 20)

Applying this thought to the two examples introduced above yields the following result: "The Königsberg bridges as so arranged were never crossed because they couldn't be crossed. Mother's strawberries were not distributed evenly among her children because they couldn't be." (p. 9) What does this "couldn't" amount to? Lange explicates this modal notion in terms of different degrees of necessities or, by the same token, varying modal strengths of laws:

These necessities are stronger than the variety of necessity possessed by ordinary laws of nature, setting [distinctively mathematical, A.R.] explanations . . . apart from ordinary scientific explanations. . . . distinctively mathematical scientific explanations work by appealing only to facts . . . that are modally stronger than ordinary laws of nature . . . . (pp. 9-10)

Lange's idea of having various "degrees of necessities" or different "modal strengths" of laws builds on his account of laws that is based on the notion of subjunctive/counterfactual stability of law statements (I refer the curious reader to Lange (2009: chapter 1 and sections 3.4-3.5) and to Lange's concise summary on pp. 72-86 this book). Lange's key idea relevant in the context of explanations by constraint is that laws differ with respect to their modal strengths. For instance, He holds that "force laws" or, alternatively, "ordinary laws of nature" are necessary truths but their necessity is weaker than the necessity attached to mathematical necessities (for instance, that, necessarily, 23 cannot be divided by 3 such that the quotient is a natural number). This view corresponds to a familiar distinction from mainstream analytic metaphysics between physical and stronger mathematical and logical necessities. If the explanatory power comes from such mathematical necessities, then we have an instance of a distinctively mathematical explanation, or so Lange claims.

However, the crucial point is that Lange applies this idea not only to mathematical necessities but also to other scientific laws. He argues for a hierarchical picture of laws, according to which, for instance, symmetry principles, conservation laws, the law of the composition of forces, and the fundamental dynamical laws (such as Newton's second law of motion, p. 29) are taken to possess a greater degree of necessity than force laws but a lower degree of necessity than mathematical truths (for a useful account of the hierarchical picture of laws, see pp. 81, 84, 106). The hierarchical picture is the basis for Lange's analysis of explanations by constraint. On a methodological level, Lange cautiously emphasizes that it is an empirical question -- that is, a matter for science, not for philosophy to figure out -- whether certain propositions (such as symmetry principles, conservation laws etc.) actually have the status of constraints.

In Chapters 2-4, Lange presents an astonishing variety of explanations by constraint that exploit scientific laws having a greater degree of necessity than force laws. Among many other examples in Chapter 2, He discusses explanations that make use of conservation laws as constraints to explain certain aspects of force laws. For instance, Lange analyzes the claim that the principle of energy conservation explains why Archimedes's principle holds (pp. 58-61). In the context of other non-causal scientific explanations, the crucial constraints are symmetry principles that explain why certain conservation laws hold. For instance, a symmetry principle such as "invariance under arbitrary temporal displacement" is taken to be a constraint explaining why energy is conserved (p. 64).

Chapter 3 focuses on a detailed case study of an explanation by constraint in the context of Einstein's special theory of relativity. Lange explores the claim that a particular symmetry principle, the principle of relativity, is the main ingredient of an explanation by constraint of the fact that the Lorentz transformations hold.

In Chapter 4, Lange provides another detailed historical case study of an explanation by constraint from classical mechanics. Lange discusses and contrasts various historical candidate explanations (causal as well as non-causal) of why the parallelogram law of the composition of forces holds. In particular, Lange explores the merits of Poisson's explanation of the parallelogram law. If Poisson's explanation holds, Lange argues, then it builds on two principles that can be understood as constraints (see p. 180 for a helpful picture): first, "that there is a law by which the resultant of two forces is determined by two components' magnitudes and directions" (p. 179), and, second, "the symmetry principle that the first-order laws are collectively invariant under spatial rotation" (p. 179). Lange suggests that if scientists accept this explanation of the parallelogram law, then they are in fact accepting a non-causal explanation by constraint.

One may wonder at this point what Lange has to say about a theory of the group of explanations by constraint, although he does not aspire any more general theory of explanation. Lange's general idea is that explanations by constraint work "by virtue of supplying information about the source of a constraint's necessity" (p. 136). As I understand Lange, he attempts to make explicit this general idea partly in terms of two conditions (pp. 136-137): (1) explanations by constraint are deductive arguments, i.e. the propositions expressing the constraint in question (plus other auxiliary assumptions) have to deductively entail the explanandum E. (2) Each of the premises of an explanatory argument has to be relevant (or non-redundant), i.e. it is not the case that some proper subset of the premises also entails explanandum E. Lange's full account of explanations by constraint further depends on the distinction between "explanatorily derivative" and "explanatorily fundamental" laws (pp. 134-135, 141-145), and the identification of different kinds of explananda (p. 131) but I cannot engage in a detailed exposition of these ideas here.

Let me also point out that Lange's account of explanations by constraint entails a prima facie helpful way to distinguish between causal and non-causal explanations in terms of modal strength. What makes an explanation by constraint non-causal is that its core explanatory principles (the constraints) refer to necessities that are stronger than the necessity of "ordinary" causal laws or force laws.

Along the way, in Chapters 1-4, Lange engages with alternative accounts in the recent literature. The highlights include: first, Lange provides a thought-provoking critical discussion of rival accounts of explanations including counterfactual approaches inspired by James Woodward's theory of explanation (pp. 86-95) and accounts of structural explanation (pp. 181-186). Second, Lange raises interesting objections to Harvey Brown's proposal of how to explain the Lorentz transformations (pp. 112-123). Third, Lange presents how explanations by constraint differ from Wesley Salmon's well-known notion of non-causal top-down explanations that Salmon distinguishes from causal bottom-up explanations (pp. 119-120).

In Part II (Chapters 5 and 6), Lange argues in a pluralist vein that there are "other kinds of non-causal scientific explanation besides explanation by constraint" (p. 189). His main examples of such non-causal explanations are "really statistical explanations" (Chapter 5) and "dimensional explanations" (Chapter 6).

According to Lange, really statistical explanations are non-causal scientific explanations that appeal to "a statistical fact of life" (p. 190) "such as regression toward the mean, departure from expectation value, or the one-sidedness of random walks" (p. 196). Now, why are really statistical explanations not explanations by constraint? Lange answers: "That is because it [i.e. a really statistical explanation] does not appeal solely to 'constraints' such as mathematical necessities . . . Crucially, an RS [really statistical] explanation appeals to the contingent fact . . . that a given system is statistical." (p. 196) Lange also seems to suggest that, because of their statistical character, really statistical explanations do not have the form of deductive arguments, as Lange's theory of explanation by constraint requires.

Similarly, Lange argues that some uses of dimensional analysis are explanatory in a non-causal way but they fail to be explanations by constraint. The kind of dimensional explanation that Lange has in mind refers to explanatory principles stating that a given quantity stands in a dimensionally homogenous relation (see p. 206 for a definition) to "a subset of other quantities" (p. 211, 219). Lange uses the quantities figuring in Newton's law of gravitation as an example. He argues that an explanatory principle of this sort is not a constraint, because "it does not possess greater necessity than an ordinary law of nature" (p. 211). (Moreover, Lange examines in detail how a dimensional explanation contrasts with a causal explanation of the same, or a similar, explanandum.)

Lange claims that there is yet another type of scientific non-causal explanation that is not an explanation by constraint. In Chapter 10, he discusses explanations of why two derivative (that is, non-fundamental) laws of physics applying to "physically unrelated phenomena" (p. 349) have the same mathematical form. Explanations of this kind do not work by appealing to constraints. Instead the explanations make use of certain common mathematical, dimensional, or structural features of the more fundamental "ordinary" laws covering the two physical phenomena in question (p. 357; see p. 351 for an instructive example).

In Part III (Chapters 7-9), Lange provides an in-depth analysis of non-causal explanations in pure mathematics. As indicated earlier and although an entire review could be concerned with this rich and rewarding discussion, I will only brush the topic of mathematical explanations.

Lange argues for two claims: first, there in fact are explanations in pure mathematics. In defending this claim, Lange opposes a common skeptical attitude among philosophers, according to which "when mathematicians apparently characterize some proof as explanatory, they are merely gesturing toward an aesthetically attractive quality that the proof possesses (such as elegance or beauty)" (p. 231). Second, Lange endorses explanatory pluralism: there are different types of mathematical explanations and they deserve different philosophical treatments. For instance, explanatory proofs come in several types exploiting different "salient" features (p. 264) for explanatory purposes: some proofs rely on symmetry properties (pp. 237-239, 241-242, 245-247), other proofs are explanatory by virtue of showing where the simplicity of the theorem being explained comes from (as argued in Chapter 7), and still another group of proofs is explanatory because it exhibits a striking unifying power (see, for instance, Chapter 8, pp. 276-278; Chapter 9, pp. 333, 337).

In the later chapters, Lange explores the metaphysical implications of his analysis of non-causal scientific and mathematical explanations (Chapters 9 and 11). Regarding metaphysical topics, his main focus is on understanding the connection between explanations and natural properties. In particular, Lange defends the metaphysical claim that the naturalness of properties and the explanatory power of proofs referring to those properties "arise together, neither is prior to the other" (p. 338). In Chapter 11, Lange further elaborates his account of natural properties and their intimate connection of explanations in science and mathematics. He proposes the following definition of natural properties: "P is natural enough to explain if and only if there is an explanation of [a law; A.R.] L in which P . . . enters as a unit" (p. 386).

Lange's metaphysics of natural properties turns out to be an important element of his pluralist outlook on explanation in science and mathematics. Although Lange holds that there is no single general theory of explanation, he also does not believe that the different types of explanations in mathematics and science are entirely disconnected and that it is arbitrary that they "deserve to be grouped together" (p. 371), and that they are all called 'explanation'. Lange argues that the connection between naturalness and explanation shows that all of these different kinds of explanations in science and mathematics share a feature, a "common thread" (p. 398): "In both mathematics and science -- and for both causal and non-causal explanations -- there are tight connections between being an explanation, being able to render similarities non-coincidental, and being a natural property . . . ." (p. 399) Lange argues that this gives us an important insight: "The common features contribute to making all of these varieties of explanation, both mathematical and scientific, into species of the same genus" (p. 399; see also p. 371).

In total, Lange's book is an excellent, creative and thought-provoking scholarly contribution to the current debate on explanation. In particular, I believe it is likely the book will have a stimulating and fruitful effect on the literature in at least three respects. (1) The book will encourage philosophers of science to broaden the philosophical debate on explanation and to move away from the narrow focus on causal-mechanistic explanation that the literature on explanation currently has (for a recent attempt to do so see the essays in Reutlinger and Saatsi forthcoming). (2) Lange's book is the ideal starting point for building further bridges between philosophical debates -- inside and outside of philosophy of science -- that are largely disconnected: work on explanations in science, mathematics, and philosophy. (3) Even if one is ultimately not convinced by Lange's pluralism, any other approach to non-causal and causal explanations (such as monism and particularism) will have to be developed in response to Lange's splendid work.


I would like to thank Marc Lange and Juha Saatsi for their helpful suggestions.


Andersen, H. (2014): "A Field Guide to Mechanisms: Part I", Philosophy Compass 9: 274-283.

Cartwright, N. (1989): Nature's Capacities and Their Measurement, Clarendon Press.

Lange, M. (2009): Laws and Lawmakers. Science, Metaphysics, and the Laws of Nature, Oxford University Press.

Morrison, M. (2015): Reconstructing Reality. Models, Mathematics, and Simulations, Oxford University Press.

Reutlinger, A. (2017): "Explanation Beyond Causation? New Directions in the Philosophy of Scientific Explanation", Philosophy Compass, Online First. 

Reutlinger, A. and Saatsi, J. (forthcoming): Explanation Beyond Causation. Philosophical Perspectives on Non-Causal Explanations, Oxford University Press.

Salmon, W. (1984): Scientific Explanation and the Causal Structure of the World, Princeton University Press.

Salmon, W. (1989): Four Decades of Scientific Explanation. University of Pittsburgh Press.

Skow, B. (2016): Reasons Why, Oxford University Press.

Woodward, J. (2003): Making Things Happen. Oxford University Press.