Beckett's Words: The Promise of Happiness in a Time of Mourning

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David Kleinberg-Levin, Beckett's Words: The Promise of Happiness in a Time of Mourning, Bloomsbury, 2015, 313pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781474216838.

Reviewed by Gerald L. Bruns, University of Notre Dame


This book is the third volume in a trilogy in which David Kleinberg-Levin attempts to develop an unorthodox philosophy of hope, one derived from the reading of a number of twentieth-century literary texts -- in other words, a philosophy that diverges from the politico-theological tradition represented by such canonical works as Ernst Bloch's The Principle of Hope (1938-47) and Jürgen Moltmann's Theology of Hope: On the Ground and the Implications of a Christian Eschatology (1964).[1] Levin does not engage these texts -- instead his recurrent references are to Walter Benjamin's secularized Messianism and T. W. Adorno's critique of Enlightenment, from both of which he takes his starting point: namely that neither a theocracy nor a world administered according to the principles of reason can save us from the ongoing catastrophes of history. For Levin, as (in different ways) for Benjamin and Adorno, the experience of disaster (hence of mourning) is the paradoxical condition that makes hope possible, if only in the form of the memory (or imagination) of happiness, or maybe simply a semblance of momentary freedom from the world as we know it.

Why turn to literature in search of hope? Perhaps one answer lies in the argument advanced years ago by philosophers like Martha Nussbaum and D. Z. Philips, namely that because of their complexity the ethical dilemmas that we face can only be addressed at the level of narrative examples rather than by way of concepts, principles, and the sittlichkeiten of moral communities. Thus in his second volume, Redeeming Words: Language and the Promise of Happiness in the Stories of Döblin and Sebald (Albany: SUNY Press, 2013), Levin takes up two German fiction writers whose characters face life in the aftermath of global war and man-made mass death. For example, in Alfred Döblin's Berlin Alexanderplatz (1929), a petty criminal, Franz Biberkopf, tries to escape his seamy life on the streets, and apparently achieves his freedom from the historical forces of character and environment that, in the tradition of naturalistic fiction (Zola's, for example), are working to destroy him -- along with the Weimar Republic as it disintegrates into fascist violence. Meanwhile W. G. Sebald's writings try to cope -- or, rather, are about Germany's attempts (and failures) to cope -- with World War II and, in particular, the Holocaust. Sebald's Austerlitz (2001) is a novel of monologues (and old photographs) in which an art historian at Oxford, Jacques Austerlitz, tries to recover his lost history, which began as a young Jewish boy brought from Prague to England in 1939 by the Kindertransport. Philosophers like Alasdair MacIntyre think that quests are driven by a desire for the good life, but Austerlitz seeks simply to recover a life he never had, which means specifically a mournful and often debilitating effort to learn of the last movements of his parents who perished in the Holocaust. If anything resembling a "promise of happiness" is fulfilled, it occurs when Austerlitz discovers a photograph of his mother and experiences both a moment of freedom from the "false" life that he has lived in England and a recognition that he simply does not belong to this (or any) world.

Perhaps what distinguishes hope from desire is that the one is provoked by the other but remains, in variously local and contingent ways, fragmentary, elusive, and mortal -- as in Percy Bysshe Shelley's famous epitaph (inscribed on a lonely rock in the desert):

"My name is Ozymandias, king of kings:

Look on my works, ye mighty, and despair."[2]

More to Levin's point, however, is the role of language in literary texts. The argument of the first volume of his trilogy, Redeeming Words and the Promise of Happiness: A Critical Theory Approach to Wallace Stevens and Vladimir Nabokov (Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2012), turns in large part on the freedom of literary language from the operations of instrumental reason, which is to say its irreducibility to the mediating functions of nomination, predication, description, and the subsumptive rule of universals. Not that poetry necessarily discards its "aboutness." Consider Wallace Stevens's sonnet, "Autumn Refrain":

The skreak and skritter of evening gone

And grackles gone and sorrows of the sun,

The sorrows of the sun, too, gone . . . the moon and


The yellow moon of words about the nightingale

In measureless measures, not a bird for me

But the name of a bird and the name of a nameless air

I have never -- shall never hear. And yet beneath

The stillness of everything gone, and being still,

Being and sitting still, something resides,

Some skreaking and skrittering residuum,

And grates these evasions of the nightingale

Though I have never -- shall never hear that bird.

And the stillness is in the key, all of it is,

The stillness is all in the key of that desolate sound.[3]

Philology knows very well how to clarify these lines, with their allusion to John Keats's "Ode to a Nightingale" -- a bird native to England but nowhere to be found in Stevens's Connecticut: hence a bird whose melodies the poet can only try (and fail) to imagine in the moonlight when at last New England's noisy grackles have settled in their nests. A grackle, by the way, is a species of lark, but its name captures the cacophony of its noise in contrast to the meadowlark's lyricism. The grackle is, frankly, a kind of pest whose "desolate sound" lingers in "the stillness of everything gone." But Levin's point, persuasively argued in his chapter on "Word-Play: Language on a Holiday," concerns the force of the poem as it draws us into the materiality of its language, the protrusion of its sounds and twists of its metaphors ("the yellow moon of words about the nightingale").[4] From a strictly logical point of view, of course, such materiality is only so much "skreaking and skrittering," but arguably it is also potentially a force of liberation -- Levin in fact calls it a "sensible experience of freedom" from rule-governed speech and its burdens of justification (p. 71).

Meanwhile, of his infamous Lolita, widely read upon its publication in the 1950s as a "dirty book," Vladimir Nabokov wrote: "For me a work of fiction exists only insofar as it affects me, what I shall bluntly call aesthetic bliss, that is a sense of being somehow, somewhere, connected with other states of being where art, curiosity, tenderness, kindness, ecstasy, are the norms."[5] Language itself, apart from its semantic operations and results, is the medium of this transport -- as the novelist and critic Susan Sontag once remarked concerning her experience on first reading Lolita: "I didn't realize that there was a possibility of an extremely refined, musical, hyperverbal, hyper-ecstatic, ideal of prose -- in English -- until I read Nabokov."[6] If the puns, anagrams, alliterations, and mellifluous sentences of Lolita do not justify the melancholy life of Nabokov's pedophile, Humbert Humbert, they at least transpose it (and the reader) into redemptive world of comedy. As Levin says, "For Nabokov, as for Stevens, paradise itself could only be the work of an extraordinary comedian" (p. 178).

Interestingly, Levin reads the prose of Döblin's novel very differently, no doubt because Döblin's prose is very different from Nabokov's. Berlin Alexanderplatz is a documentary montage of "low" forms of speech (the argot, ads, slogans, newspapers, and popular songs) found on the streets of Berlin in the late 1920s. Benjamin, in his essay on Döblin, remarks that the ordinary Berliner "speaks as a connoisseur, in love with the way things are said."[7] But Levin here (for once) contests Benjamin, hearing in Döblin's vernacular "a dangerous aestheticization of language expressing and enacting a causality of Fate" (p. 47).[8] The rhyming syncopations and other (pounding) sound patterns in the novel are no longer playful but, on Levin's reading, more closely echo the regimented jackboots of Hitler's followers (pp. 57-59).

Levin's standpoint here is arguably more European than American in its Modernism. He sides, for example, with the French poet Stéphane Mallarmé, who sought to liberate language from the speech of everyday life (as represented especially in newspapers), against the American poet William Carlos Williams, who argued that poetry is already at play in the American idiom -- hence his famous motto: "A poem can be made of anything" (even newspaper clippings).[9] Döblin, however, sides with Williams against Mallarmé, for whom the typography of the printed book is the proper medium for poetry. Rejecting any notion of la poésie pur, Döblin argues that "The book spells the death of real languages," for such languages are nowhere to be found if not in the speech of everyday urban life.[10]

Which perhaps helps to explain Levin's attraction to the work of Samuel Beckett, an Irishman who composed his fiction and stage pieces in French, subsequently translating them himself into English. Beckett has long been associated with French existentialism and its preoccupation with the paradoxes of "extreme situations" (waiting, suffering, dying -- and writing!), and in this spirit Levin wants

to argue that what Beckett gives us, what he represents in his stories and on the stage, showing us to ourselves with the redemptive power of painful honesty, is not the fanciful world of a possible future, not our world as if already redeemed, but our world revealed, exposed in all its nakedness and destitution, drifting in the most extreme existential anguish (pp. 94-95: my emphasis).

As if one could redeem catastrophe by not averting one's eyes but only, as Stanley Cavell would say, by acknowledging its implacable reality and the claim this has on our capacity for empathy and compassion -- and perhaps even the amusement (or is it bemusement?) of recognition.[11]

The absurd man, said Camus, knows that in this world "there is no further place for hope."[12] Which is perhaps why, as in The Fall (1956), laughter for Camus is a derisive guffaw, in contrast to Beckett's absurdities, which provoke a liberating hilarity, as when, in Endgame, the aged and crippled Nagg lifts the lid off decrepit Nell's trash bin, and she pops up:


What is it, my pet?


Time for love?

As Hugh Kenner observed, in hearing Beckett's dialogue, we also "hear ourselves betrayed into laughter."[13]

And therein, as Levin argues in the final volume of his trilogy, lies the redemptive power of Beckett's words -- the way they violate the decorum of misery that Beckett's characters are forced, endlessly but finally comically, to preserve. Levin is drawn almost exclusively to Beckett's later fiction, principally Comment c'est (1961), an work of parataxis or "sentence-fragments that have been assembled to form blocks of text with no punctuation marks at all and with no obvious principles of coherence, unity, and temporality in operation" (p. 199).[14] Disconnected words simply rain down upon (and through) a nameless narrator who crawls endlessly through a sea of mud, a sack containing tins of sardines tied round his neck -- words the narrator is compelled to recite to no purpose, except perhaps to draw from them memories (sometimes bitter, sometimes bright) together with anticipations and (later) recollections of his encounter in the mud with another suffering transient, Pim:

how it was I quote before Pim with Pim after Pim how it is three part I say it as I hear it

voice once without quaqua on all sides then in me when the panting stops tell me again finish telling me invocation

past moments old dreams back again or fresh like those that pass or things things always and memories I say them as I hear them murmur them in the mud[15]

Parataxis, as Lyotard observed, frees language from the logical and cognitive "regimens" that otherwise assemble us into hypotactic forms of life that require us to keep in step.[16] Beckett's How It Is (like Kafka's work before him) is a reduction ad absurdum of such regimens, which are powerful but pointless and, as such, ludicrous as well.

Levin, meanwhile, reads How It Is as a Hobbesian-Hegelian allegory (pp. 186ff.). The sea of mud through which the narrator travels to and from Pim is a world of each against all -- tormentors and victims -- but Levin brings Hegel to the rescue by figuring their brutal encounter (in which the narrator pummels Pim) as a master-slave dialectic that eventually resolves itself into a (possible) relation of "mutual recognition and mutual acknowledgment": arguably a shadow, at least, of justice (p. 199):

in the dark the mud my head against his my side glued to his my right arm round his shoulders his cries have ceased we lie thus a good moment they are good moments (How It Is, p. 54)

a little tune suddenly he sings a little tune suddenly like all that was not then is I listen for a moment they are good moments it can only be he but I may be mistaken (How It Is, p. 55)

samples whatever comes remembered imagined no knowing life above life here God in heaven yes or no if he loved me a little if Pim loved me a little yes or no if I loved him a little in the dark the mud in spite of all a little affection find someone at last someone find you at last live together glued together love each other a little love a little without being loved be loved a little without loving answer that leave it vague leave it dark (How It Is, p. 74)

If: that is to say, "no knowing." A good and faithful Cartesian would have no need, much less use, for hope, which is, on Levin's argument, the one thing that remains when destitution leaves us, like Beckett's characters, derelict survivors.

The open (unanswerable) question is: hope for what? Perhaps simply a final freedom from how it is:

so things may change no answer and no answer I may choke no answer sink no answer silly the mud no more no answer the dark no answer trouble the peace no more no answer the silence no answer die not answer DIE screams I MAY DIE screams I SHALL DIE screams good (How It is, p. 147)

Yet in all likelihood even death will be withheld. One can't help recalling the last words of Beckett's Unnamable: "you must go on, I can't go on, I'll go on."[17]

[1] For another twist, see John D. Caputo's offbeat Hoping Against Hope: Confessions of a Postmodern Pilgrim (Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 2015).

[2] Percy Bysshe Shelley, "Ozymandias," The Major Works (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2003), p. 198.

[3] The Collected Poems of Wallace Stevens (New York: Alfred A. Knopf, 1964), p. 160.

[4] See, in this connection, Beverly Maeder, Wallace Stevens's Experimental Language: The Lion in the Lute (New York: St. Martin's Press, 1999), esp. pp. 78-94 ("The Material of 'Being'").

[5] "On a Book Entitled Lolita," in Lolita (Hammondsworth: Penguin Books, 1980), p. 313.

[6] From an interview, in "Three Encounters with W. G. Sebald (February 1992-July 2013)," ed. Richard Sheppard, Journal of European Studies 44.4 (2014): 397.

[7] "The Crisis of the Novel," Selected Writings, II: 1927-1934, ed. Marcus Bullock, et al. (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999), p. 301.

[8]See Griseldis W. Crowhurst-Bond, "The Language of Violence in Alfred Döblin's novel, Berlin Alexanderplatz," Journal of Literary Studies, 2.1 (1986): 58-71.

[9] See Mallarmé, "Le Mystère dans les lettres" (1896), Œuvres de Mallarmé (Paris: Bordas, 1992), pp. 305-7; and Williams, "Kora in Hell: Improvisations" (1920), Imaginations, ed. Webster Scott (New York: New Directions, 1970), p. 70.

[10] Cited by Benjamin, "The Crisis of the Novel," Selected Writings, II, p. 300: "The stylistic principle governing [Berlin Alexanderplatz] is that of montage. Petty-bourgeois printed matter, scandalmongering, stories of accidents, the sensational incidents of 1928, folk songs, and advertisements rain down on this text."

[11] See Cavell's "The Avoidance of Love: A Reading of King Lear," Must We Mean What We Sa? A Book of Essays (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1969), esp. pp. 313-14.

[12] "An Absurd Reasoning," The Myth of Sisyphus and Other Essays, trans. Justin O'Brien (New York: Vintage Books, 1969), p. 28. See also p. 44:

The absurd man thus catches sight of a burning and frigid, transparent and limited universe in which nothing is possible but everything is given, and beyond which all is collapse and nothingness. He can then decide to accept such a universe and draw from it his strength, his refusal to hope, and unyielding evidence of a life without consolation (my emphasis).

[13] A Reader's Guide to Samuel Beckett (Syracuse: Syracuse University Press, 1973), p. 121.

[14] See Ewa Ziarek, "The Paratactic Prose of Samuel Beckett's How It Is," The Rhetoric of Failure (Albany: SUNY Press, 1996), pp. 157-99, esp. pp. 172-74.

[15] How It Is (New York: Grove Press, 1964), p. 7. See Hugh Kenner, "Samuel Beckett: Comedian of the Impasse," The Stoic Comedians: Flaubert, Joyce, and Beckett (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1974), pp. 66-107.

[16] The Differend: Phrases in Dispute, trans. Georges Van Den Abbeele (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1988), pp. 65-67.

[17] Molloy, Malone Dies, The Unnamable: Three Novels (New York: Grove Press, 1958), p. 414.