Becoming a Subject

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Marcia Cavell, Becoming a Subject, Oxford University Press, 2006, 182pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0199287082.

Reviewed by Michael Lacewing, Heythrop College, London


Marcia Cavell's recent book is the continuation of a 'conversation between philosophy and psychoanalysis' in which she has been engaged for some time. Her previous monograph, The Psychoanalytic Mind (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1993), was a powerful and sustained argument in favour of an interpretation of psychoanalysis and children's mental development informed by a broadly Davidsonian perspective on mind and meaning. Her theme in Becoming a Subject is the nature of self, which she understands as the self-conscious, reflective, judging, reason-giving self -- 'someone who recognizes herself as an 'I', as having her own peculiar perspective' (1).

Philosophers sceptical about the claims or use of psychoanalytic theory will do well to look particularly at the first two chapters. Chapter 1 provides an excellent synopsis of research in neuroscience on memory that supports an updated psychoanalytic model of the mind. Reviewing the evidence, Cavell concludes that

Freud seems to have been right, then, in claiming that trauma affects unconscious memory; that memories can date to early childhood; that childhood experiences reverberate through one's life, affecting how we perceive the world and what we do; that we may have little or no conscious recollection of an experience that has nevertheless left powerful, implicit, emotional memories; that we unconsciously 'know' something without knowing that we do; that there is motivated unknowing; and that present behaviour can be out of touch with present reality through the work of what we might now call unconscious, procedural, memories that serve a defensive purpose. (20-1)

Chapter 2 is a sustained and well-argued discussion of the role of anxiety, taking as its lead Freud's revised theory of anxiety and repression in 'Inhibition, Symptoms and Anxiety' (1926), the implications of which Cavell argues have not been properly recognized. She insightfully discusses the complexity and meaning of anxiety (against those who would seek to explain it as a 'mere feeling'), and the development from initial defence through our capacity for symbolic thinking and linking to a stabilized defensive response. This in turn constrains our desires and our perception of reality, generalizing into a character trait and affecting our sense of self and agency (38). Hence, she rightly argues, creating the ability to tolerate and work with anxiety is central to achieving an understanding of and release from it. And for those not familiar with the realities of psychoanalytic practice, and the details of the underlying theory supporting that practice, Chapter 3 helpfully develops the distinction between remembering, repeating, and working through.

Four central ideas -- central to psychoanalysis and central to understanding the self -- emerge as important for philosophers to note: the prevalence of unconscious mental functioning; the implications of different forms of memory; the importance of anxiety and defence; and the way the past constantly informs the present.

The most notable theme for psychoanalysts is the importance of reality in the development and sustenance of the self: 'there has been a tendency in psychoanalysis to lose sight of the fact that we are animals in a real, physical world, equipped to deal with and to register what endangers us there and what helps us thrive. Through this book runs the theme that psychological space demands physical space; that the inner world is embedded in, and fabricated from, interactions between world and mind' (1). Her presentation of philosophical ideas to this end provides a very clear and accessible introduction to one way of thinking about the mind.

These are real strengths. But unfortunately, the book is disappointing, and in a number of ways. A first is formal: Of the ten chapters, five are revised versions of previous papers, and although they are on closely related topics, the book as a whole does not properly cohere as either a collection of papers or as a monograph. The chapters are divided into three sections: memory and mind, which looks at neuroscience, memory, anxiety, and therapeutic practice; on self, reality and other selves, which presents Davidsonian arguments on 'triangulation' and intentional content, and a critical discussion of Frankfurt's view of the self; and (somewhat misleadingly entitled) problems of the self, which covers irrationality, freedom, emotion, and self-knowledge. There are significant overlaps between discussions within each section, yet it is also difficult to bring the whole into a single theoretical conception of what it is to be a self.

A second difficulty facing the book is its audience. Despite the appeal to both philosophers and psychoanalysts, both, I suspect, will find the discussions unsatisfactory in different ways. Philosophers, once convinced of the four points listed above, may well find the discussions in other chapters unsatisfactory, if occasionally illuminating in Cavell's use of psychoanalytic ideas. Of the five reprinted papers, three were originally published in journals of psychoanalysis in which -- quite appropriately -- philosophical exposition and argument is not as detailed or deep as in philosophy journals. I felt that this 'lighter philosophical touch' had spread from those three papers to much else in the book. For example, Cavell assumes the Davidsonian position throughout the book without once considering objections or alternatives (more on the problems this causes below), even while demonstrating her awareness of them. In general, with the exception of Chapter 6 (which discusses Frankfurt), there is little engagement with alternative philosophical theories, merely a presentation of Cavell's own. On the other hand, psychoanalysts (and philosophers of psychoanalysis) may be frustrated by her lack of engagement with other interpretations of psychoanalytic theory, ones that can respect the insights of this position without necessarily drawing the inferences, e.g. about intentional content, that Cavell does herself.

It is to this issue -- of intentional content -- that I now turn, an issue of considerable difficulty and much recent debate amongst psychoanalysts, child development theorists, and philosophers of psychology (amongst others). At the heart of her book, and as a central contribution and defence of her contention regarding the role of reality in psychological development, Cavell places a discussion of the nature of meaning and meaningful thought (Chapters 4 and 5), during which she draws heavily on Davidson on triangulation and Wittgenstein on the basis of meaning in practice. She is interested in what is required for what she terms (following Mead) 'symbolic' or propositional thought and communication. But the discussion is confused, or at least confusing, as many distinctions that need to be observed are not.

Cavell first appears to align propositional thought with intentionality (62), though it is unclear at this point whether she considers that all intentional mental states are propositional. However, she runs them together a second time, when discussing the development of propositional thought: 'The implication is not that before the infant has propositional thoughts and intentional states, nothing at all is going on in her head, though it is hard to say what it is' (70). On the other hand, when noting the importance to symbolic thought of distinguishing correct from incorrect use, she says

This makes normativity central to what Mead called symbolic thought; and it brings sentences, even one-word sentences like 'Mama!', to the fore of our investigation. For words are learned in context … We are not interested in isolated symbols but in propositional thought, in how the child learns to say it is or it is not so. (65)

But 'Mama!' does not express a propositional thought, even when it becomes more than an 'isolated symbol', and even when the child uses it with an awareness of its correct application (as another example: Cavell asks when we can say the child means an apple by 'apple' (66)). Here, I would want to say, we have a thought with intentional content, indeed with conceptual content, but not with propositional content. I suggest that Cavell has at least confused propositional content with conceptual, and possibly both with intentional content. (That intentional content need not be propositional is argued well by John Searle (1983), Tim Crane (2001) and Richard Wollheim (1999); and the debate over non-conceptual content suggests the jury is still out over whether all intentional content must be conceptual. Cavell's failure to consistently make the distinction between propositional and intentional content and to see its implications also unfortunately detracts from her discussion of irrationality in Ch. 7.)

Cavell compounds this error, putting symbolic thought well out of reach of children under the age of around five. She argues that the condition of being able to distinguish correct and incorrect use not only requires the ability to distinguish between truth and falsehood, but also between appearance and reality: 'if you have a belief of a propositional sort … you must have a grasp of the distinction between how you think things are and how they (truly) are' (66). She claims that intentional states presuppose judgment (80), which is propositional and presupposes a concept of truth, which in turn presupposes a grasp of the distinction between subjective and objective, and between your perspective and mine (74-5). She refers to triangulation, when mother and child respond to one and the same object, and co-ordinate their responses. She notes: 'The questions can then arise: Who is right, she or I? What is the object really like?' (67). Furthermore, Cavell argues, following Grice, that for symbolic communication, the listener must not only discern the intention of the speaker to mean something, but know that the speaker has an intention and belief (62). This again requires a conceptualization of the contents of others' minds, and of speech as expressing them.

On Cavell's account, as far as I can make out, before a child can conceptualize other points of view, which may or may not align with reality, and which are expressed in verbal communication, a child cannot communicate or think symbolically (or with intentional content, if Cavell does equate symbolic thought with intentional content). But this is all too much; while a child must realize Daddy is not meant by 'Mama' in order to mean its mother by 'Mama' (or 'That's Mama' -- which is at least a proposition), it does not need to be self-conscious enough to understand the gap between its thought and reality. A form of symbolic meaning and communication may emerge with what Bernard Williams (2002) calls 'plain truths', truths available to any who look. Triangulation, e.g. using gaze, occurs very young indeed (around 6-8 months, according to Vasudevi Reddy (2001)), but Cavell's questions can only arise years later (around 4 or 5, as measured by the famous 'false belief test'), when the child can use and articulate the concept of distinct points of view. From the evidence of children's communication before this stage of development, I would argue that Cavell is mistaken in what is required for intentional content and even for propositional thought. This is not to reject the crucial importance of triangulation for intentional content; as I have mentioned, triangulation takes place very early indeed, which would allow intentional thought to be possible from far earlier than Cavell indirectly suggests.

Cavell's conception of intentional content leads to trouble in another way as well when we return to the question of the nature of an infant's mental states prior to propositional/intentional thought:

The implication is not that before the infant has propositional thoughts and intentional states, nothing at all is going on in her head, though it is hard to say what it is. At the very least, infants have feelings, emotions, sensations, purposes, instincts, they communicate, perceive, and learn … early infant-parent exchanges have much to do with whether the child begins to feel that she can, or cannot, make herself understood. (70)

Apart from the fact that it is unclear what Cavell could mean by 'the child feels that she can make herself understood' prior to propositional thought, her attribution of emotions to infants here suggests that emotions do not have intentional content. This is at odds with her theory of emotion, outlined in Chapter 9, where she says that 'As orientations toward the world, emotions have intentionality … An emotion is also intentional if it takes a proposition as its object' (133). Here, and elsewhere in that discussion, Cavell clearly defends the view that the intentional content of emotions need not be propositional. Attributing emotions, and hence intentional mental states, to infants is highly plausible, but only because the theory of intentional content Cavell defends in Chapters 4 and 5 is repudiated -- quite rightly -- in Chapter 9.

One implication of Cavell's argument is that 'only when there are, for the child, objects that are truly public can there also be 'objects' that are truly inner in a subjective, inner world' (67). In Chapter 5, she uses this idea, together with reflections on Freud's reality principle and the nature of judging, to attack a popular position in psychoanalytic theory regarding the representations in an infant's mind known as 'internal objects', following Melanie Klein and Wilfrid Bion. Her attack is an important challenge to a view that, it must be said, is philosophically and empirically under-developed. But it is seriously marred both by the confusions noted above, and her lack of reference to other philosophers, such as Richard Wollheim and Sebastian Gardner, who have attempted a defence of it. Her interpretation of the psychoanalytic theories under discussion is distortingly filtered through her thoughts on propositional content: Discussing Bion and Klein's theory of phantasy (which they believe underpins thinking), she argues that because phantasies are said to have intentional content, they presume judgment, and goes on to talk of the requirements on belief (80-1). But phantasies are not a species of belief nor do they involve beliefs (see Gardner 1993). Interpreting Kleinian theory in the language of propositional attitudes such as belief does indeed lead to incoherence; which is why one should observe the distinction between propositional attitudes and those mental states -- such as phantasies and emotions -- that many psychoanalysts now claim for the core of the unconscious mind. Indeed, Cavell herself notes that emotions and anxiety are now the cornerstone of psychoanalytic theory (35; 137); and this, I feel, makes the lack of clarity on the nature of mental content that much more important. Cavell's conclusion 'that the infant mind is acquainted with reality from the first, and comes to understand it as reality in the very process in which it becomes able to think' (82) doesn't require her particular defence of it (see Lear 1990).

There are a number of surprising slips in the book:

1. Odysseus is said to return to Helen, rather than Penelope (58);

2. Cavell confuses two distinct psychoanalytic cases. She takes Davidson's citation of an obsessional patient of Freud's who removed a stick from the path only to replace it later -- a case cited in a footnote of Freud's (1909) work on the Rat Man, but not about the Rat Man -- to be referring to an episode in which the Rat Man removes and later replaces a stone in the road (99);

3. Aristotle is said to be the first to ask whether emotions can be rational and educable; but Plato had surely already posed this question!

Cavell's discussion is rich in ideas, and both philosophers and psychoanalysts will find insights that inspire new thoughts and new directions of thought. It is a shame, therefore, that it is not more rigorous.


Crane, T. (2001) Elements of Mind (Oxford: Oxford University Press), Ch. 1

Freud, S. (1909) Notes Upon a Case of Obsessional Neurosis, Standard Edition of the Complete Works of Sigmund Freud, Vol. X, translated and edited by J. Strachey (London: Hogarth Press)

Gardner, S. (1993) Irrationality and the Philosophy of Psychoanalysis (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), Ch. 6

Lear, J. (1990) Love and Its Place in Nature (New Haven: Yale University Press), Ch. 3 (esp. §III)

Reddy, V. (2001) 'Mind Knowledge in Infancy: Understanding Attention and Intention in the first year', in G.J. Bremner & A. Fogel (Eds.) Blackwell Handbook of Infancy Research (Oxford: Blackwell)

Searle, J. (1983) Intentionality (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press), Ch. 1, § V

Williams, B. (2002) Truth and Truthfulness (Princeton: Princeton University Press), pp. 45-53

Wollheim, R. (1999) On the Emotions (New Haven: Yale University Press), Lecture I, §§8-10