Becoming God: Pure Reason in Early Greek Philosophy

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Patrick Lee Miller, Becoming God: Pure Reason in Early Greek Philosophy, Continuum, 2011, 179pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847061645.

Reviewed by Daniel W. Graham, Brigham Young University


This book explores the notion, found in some early Greek philosophers, that humans can become divine or god-like through reason. Patrick Lee Miller of Duquesne University provides a general introductory chapter, followed by a chapter each devoted to Heraclitus, Parmenides and the Pythagoreans, and Plato, respectively. This is, then, something like a history of ideas focusing on some important philosophical themes and developments. The topic, if foreign to modern ways of thinking, is interesting precisely because it gets to the heart of some unique Greek concerns, and it exercises an influence into late antiquity and early Christian theology. What then can we learn from such a study?

In the introductory chapter, Miller interweaves references to philosophical conceptions of philosophers like Empedocles, Anaxagoras, Plato, and Aristotle, with a brief discussion of myths such as those of Heracles and Oedipus, which illustrate early Greek views of immortality. He points out that Sophocles' Oedipus attains immortality not by reason or self-knowledge, but through suffering, perhaps as a tacit warning against new philosophical ideas (6). This is an interesting insight in a chapter that should provide the historical and cultural context for an exploration of philosophical theories. But we do not get a consistent account of the background: how radical was the philosophical appeal to reason? Miller jumps back and forth between myth and philosophy, and between one philosopher and another, without bringing the cultural understanding into sharp focus. He lays out the results of some of the interpretations he will develop in later chapters, but the reader is not prepared to digest them without the texts and arguments that come later. The introduction should probably do more introducing and less concluding.

In the second chapter, Miller develops an interpretation of Heraclitus as pursuing divine reason. In a section on "illogical logos" he argues that some of Heraclitus' paradoxical sayings really bring out contradictions in the world (13-18). In particular, fr. 65, which portrays fire as "need and satiety," commits him to such a view. (I find the evidential basis weak and the argument unconvincing for so strong and uncharitable a conclusion.) One becomes oneself by self-inquiry: "I went in search of myself" (fr. 101) reveals a contradiction of being oneself and not-oneself as being both the seeker and the one sought. The "self is nothing other than this activity [of self-inquiry]: its thinking about itself must be a thinking of its own thinking" (28), in an Aristotelian paradox.

Miller has some valuable things to say on this topic. A number of Heraclitus' fragments employ an ABBA syntactic or semantic structure known in rhetoric as chiasmus. Miller sees fr. 10 as licensing an understanding of mind (nous) as a "dialectical movement between synthesis and analysis" expressed in chiasmus (38). "The principle of chiasmus," he concludes, "reveals itself as the logos not only of understanding, but ultimately of divine self-knowledge" (38). Indeed, Heraclitus' god is "the divine chiasmus of unity and plurality" (38). To be like god means in part to recognize "our own divine chiasmus" (38). "Not reconciling contradiction but maintaining both it and reconciliation in chiasmus, the wise are analogous to a brightly burning fire" (42). As interesting as this is, I am not sure what it means. While no doubt humans embody contraries, I do not see how these entail contradictions (given that there are a number of ways of "reconciling" contraries), nor how a rhetorical trope can serve as a model of mental activity.

Chapter 3 discusses Parmenides and the Pythagoreans. In Parmenides the goddess "exposes the contradictions immanent not only in time, motion, and change, but also in fragmentation, diversity, and imperfection." "Above all . . . her argument aims to dispel the illusion of time. . . . Transcending time . . . mortality shall put on immortality" (46). Fr. 3 should be read as expressing an identity between thinking and being. "Assimilating our minds to Truth . . . we recognize that our thinking is already identical to divine being" (51). The proem of Parmenides' poem suggests a journey to the underworld and a cultic initiation. This brings us to possible parallels with the Pythagoreans, who favor a kind of dualism. This dualism may be inspired by Zoroastrianism from Persia. But for monism we must go to India, which may have inspired the Pythagoreans and other Greeks with ideas of reincarnation and eschatology, as well as asceticism and vegetarianism.

There are several problems with this sequence of connections. First, the real lesson of the researches of Walter Burkert and Carl Huffman on the Pythagoreans, whose work Miller acknowledges, is not that we need to be careful in reconstructing Pythagorean philosophy, but that there is no Pythagorean philosophy as such. Further, links between Parmenides and (usually unknown) Pythagoreans remain unproved and conjectural. Moreover, parallels between cultures are not sufficient to establish causal interactions; additional interchanges of the right sort must be established, and so far they have not been for philosophical transmissions (nor is there any hope that they will be). In any event, there remains the question of what difference it would make to our understanding of Greek philosophy to know that some ideas associated with Greek philosophy originally came from southern Asia. Miller never really ties in the religious travelogue with the philosophical problem. Parmenides' argument is still proposed in the context of Greek philosophical debates, not Persian or Indian religious traditions. All in all, it would be better to spend more time with Parmenides and less with alleged Pythagorean traditions and their possible oriental antecedents. As it is, the material on Parmenides seems brief and incompletely argued.

The final chapter (ch. 4) provides an interesting examination of Plato's views. Drawing a distinction between the early, Socratic, dialogues and the middle dialogues (as I think is desirable), Miller sees Plato as introducing the Forms and the theory of recollection in the latter. He sees the Phaedo as deeply influenced by Pythagorean models and devoted to purification. The Republic presents an ascent to the Forms and a "super unity, a Form of Forms, the Form of the Good" (100). Plato invokes a "principle of consistency" to distinguish three parts of the soul (106-7). In these dialogues and in the Symposium and Phaedrus we see a picture of a transcendent kind of knowledge: "We are pure reason: thinking thinking thinking" (113).

The locus classicus for later discussions of divinization is Plato's Theaetetus 176b-c, where he famously speaks of homoiōsis theōi (b1). Miller cites this passage thematically at the beginning of his book (1), but never returns to examine Plato's argument in detail (he cites the passage incidentally in the Plato chapter at 148 n. 53 and 157 n. 263, the only other citations I found -- though since the book does not have an index locorum and the general index's references to dialogues are incomplete, I may have missed something). One wishes for some sort of explication de texte or at least a thorough review of Plato's foundational statement in its dialectical context.

Miller focuses on important stages in the conception of human divinization. Still, the story would be more complete with a fuller discussion of Xenophanes' theology than Miller provides (he discusses him briefly in this context: 23, 51). Xenophanes makes the most explicit connection between intelligence and deity of any early thinker and provides an essential link for the larger story. One wishes Miller had dropped the Pythagoreans and devoted that space to Xenophanes instead. Throughout the book, Miller provides rich annotation to his arguments in endnotes with references to ancient sources and modern scholarship. One notable gap, however, is the small but valuable body of literature studying ancient natural theology. If this book is about becoming God, then one would expect some extended discussion of different conceptions of the God or gods that humans are supposed to emulate, and some appreciation of the scholarly effort to reconstruct ancient philosophical theology. Works both older and more recent are missing from the notes and bibliography, such as Werner Jaeger's The Theology of the Early Greek Philosophers (1947), Gregory Vlastos' "Theology and Philosophy in Early Greek Thought" (1952), Lloyd Gerson's God and Greek Philosophy: Studies in the Early History of Natural Theology (1990), and Adam Drozdek's Greek Philosophers as Theologians: The Divine Arche (2007). Further, Miller fails to cite Arnold Hermann's To Think Like God: Pythagoras and Parmenides (2004), which plows some of the same ground that he does.

So there remains more that could be said. Nevertheless, Miller provides an interesting study of the possibility of human transcendence through rationality in the early Greek tradition. He plans to pursue this topic into later Greek philosophy where it becomes even more prominent, and his study already points the way to Aristotle's life of reason. We may look forward for the sequel to carry on his study.