Becoming Political: Spinoza's Vital Republicanism and the Democratic Power of Judgment

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Christopher Skeaff, Becoming Political: Spinoza's Vital Republicanism and the Democratic Power of Judgment, University of Chicago Press, 2018, 176pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226555478.

Reviewed by Hasana Sharp, McGill University


Spinoza's political philosophy is difficult to categorize. He has been claimed by various traditions (all of which are themselves internally diverse): liberalism, libertarianism, radical democracy, communism, republicanism, feminism, and probably others. Sometimes it is difficult to tell whether advocates of various traditions are reading the same Theological-Political Treatise (or, much more rarely, the Political Treatise), but they discover a surprisingly diverse range of affinities with their own views as well as insights into contemporary problems. Nevertheless, Spinoza's naturalism and determinism make his political philosophy an awkward fit for most traditions persisting today. Although these traditions may not depend upon any particular metaphysics or anthropology, contemporary political theories typically ground themselves in some notion of human will or choice, and understand their task to be fundamentally normative. Government is usually understood to follow (logically more than chronologically) from human decision, consent, or collective will, and its prescribed role is to protect and produce a domain of choice. Yet, Spinoza understands choice (as we typically understand it) to be an illusion. Moreover, he represents political right as the actual capacity to do this or that, rather than as a normative property according to which one is owed this or that as a matter of justice.

Christopher Skeaff's ambitious and creative book aligns Spinoza's thought with today's radical democrats and civic republicans, who emphasize collective participation, deliberation, and judgment. With the resources of Spinoza interpreted in (sometimes conflictual) dialogue with radical French and Italian thought, Skeaff re-describes those phenomena in terms of the "vital normativity" (borrowed from Georges Canguilhem) arising from the activities of living beings. The scholarship in this book is wide-ranging and the writing is clear but conceptually dense. The book is historically and philologically sensitive and yet trained on contemporary political theory. The result is an historically-informed intervention into contemporary democratic theory, guided by Spinoza's political philosophy. This thoughtful and well-researched engagement with Spinoza allows Skeaff to interpret features of political life dear to radical democrats and civic republicans -- participation, agonism, and deliberation -- in a deeply embodied and naturalistic manner. He thereby builds a case for Spinoza as a resource for a "vital" conception of republicanism, according to which "judgment" is the power of a multitude to make law, and to produce its own constitution in an ongoing dynamic relationship with the State.

The idea of "vital republicanism" is provocative and interesting. In contrast to the neo-republicanism of someone like Philip Pettit, for whom individuality and choice play central roles, Skeaff's radically democratic version of republicanism diverges more sharply from mainstream analytic political philosophy. The vital republicanism that Skeaff discovers in Spinoza emerges from involuntary, collective practices of "judging" that are not necessarily conscious, inevitably shared ("common"), and richly affective. 'Judgment' and 'jurisprudence' are thus the key terms in Skeaff's reconstruction of Spinoza's political theory. The ideas of judging and deliberation tend to conjure the ideas of free will and individual minds reflecting on reasons, but they need not. Deliberation is central to ancient political theory, which did not understand human beings to have radically free wills. And judgment, for Spinoza, is not distinct from affect, which is more or less active, but always follows natural laws that are the same for every part of nature. Thus, deliberation and judgment cease, in Skeaff's telling, to be applications of moral theory to practical life and become emergent phenomena that living beings inevitably generate in their particular (historically and characterologically shaped) collective efforts to live well. Skeaff recovers from Spinoza a central and emphatically positive role for (embodied and shared) judgment in political theory. He likewise represents human life, in Spinoza's eyes, as inevitably political, necessarily contributing to the power that produces life in common (hence the title).

The book generates a surprising and productive conversation between radical democrats, neovitalists, and Italian radical thinkers. Skeaff ultimately comes down (strongly, I think) on the side of deliberative democracy. Whatever insight he draws from the radical republican tradition of thinkers such as Antonio Negri, he emphatically rejects their anti-Statism. The radical Italians outline a complex position according to which popular power is, at the same time, the true source of State authority and an essentially antagonistic force, necessarily in tension with State power. Skeaff inherits from this tradition an understanding of republicanism as something that exceeds civic participation in the official business of ruling. The power of the people is expressed in the texture of everyday affective life -- in the embodied experience of desire, community (commonality), and institutions. In contrast to the radical Italian view, however, Skeaff's vital republicanism is not anti-State and it is emphatically not anti-juridical. Skeaff ultimately breaks with their position -- though perhaps by overlooking, for example, Del Lucchese's arguments concerning the nature of law for Spinoza -- by heralding the power of deliberation and judgment to generate and sustain institutional and legal authority.

As a scholar of Spinoza's ethical and political philosophy, I am not yet convinced that judgment plays a profound role in Spinoza's political thought. Does "judgment" help us better understand the political role played by affect in Spinoza's political works? For example, in the Political Treatise, Spinoza declares that every political order emerges because "a multitude naturally agrees, and wishes to be led, as if by one mind, not because reason is guiding them, but because of some common affect" (Ch. 6, par. 1). This affect, according to Spinoza, is typically "a common hope, or fear, or a common desire to avenge some harm." Calling the affects that guide a multitude "judgment" risks underplaying Spinoza's departure from Descartes on the relationship between mental representations and the will. For Spinoza, affect and judgment cannot be separated: they are two names for the same thing. Maybe this risk pays off for Skeaff, who aims to insert Spinoza into a current conversation in democratic theory? By using the language of "judgment" to refer to the basic striving of human beings to pool our resources of thought by virtue of shared desires and fears, he allows Spinoza to interact with post-Arendtians for whom judgment and the formation of common sense is something like the medium of political life. I will be very interested to learn whether these theorists find that Spinoza enables them to differently describe and think about the phenomena in which they are most interested. And this is only the most important of several conversations for which Skeaff's scholarly achievement has laid the ground.

One question I am left with at the end of the book is whether the damaging and dangerous aspects of political judgment (affect) receive sufficient attention. Is the emphasis on the affirmative, expansive, and liberating power of collective deliberation and judgment prescriptive or descriptive? I already mentioned that one affect Spinoza emphasizes in the Political Treatise is the desire for revenge. A multitude can come together (Spinoza implies that this is rather common) by virtue of a longing to avenge a common injury. Shared resistance to harm can certainly be a virtue, which might pressure the civil order to modify a source of common suffering. Yet, there are also many examples of a collective desire to attack a perceived harm that is shaped by ignorance, erroneous judgment, or worse. Can't their (our) passions generate the ultimi barbarorum? Aren't the causes of the multitude's poor judgment one of Spinoza's central concerns? Likewise, doesn't he express acute worry about the self-undermining tendencies of masses as well as those of political authority? Doesn't civil order too often respond to harms with new harms? Aren't laws too often exercises of domination rather than expressions of popular vitality?

In the Political Treatise, Spinoza evinces great suspicion of the motives of rulers, expecting them always to favor themselves and those close to them. In the Theological-Political Treatise and the Ethics, he is intensely ambivalent about popular wisdom, sometimes seeming to despair at human folly and, at other times, promising that humanity might come together in friendship to collectively promote our common good. Skeaff, along with many in the French and Italian traditions, highlights the liberating potential of Spinoza's thinking. We certainly need an empowering political vision, and many of us find one in Spinoza. At the same time, it is difficult to avoid being overwhelmed today by the cruelty and domination that occur under the banner of both popular and State power. Spinoza has no less to teach us today about those vital forces that act against life, empowerment, and freedom. Skeaff and others are not wrong to foreground the affirmative character of Spinoza's ethics and politics. Spinoza declares that, insofar as we are free, we think of life. But we ignore at our peril the extent to which we are not free, driven to make judgments under the threat of death.