Becoming Who We Are: Politics and Practical Philosophy in the Work of Stanley Cavell

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Andrew Norris, Becoming Who We Are: Politics and Practical Philosophy in the Work of Stanley Cavell, Oxford University Press, 2017, 310pp., $85.00, ISBN 9780190673949.

Reviewed by Russell B. Goodman, University of New Mexico


This book provides an introduction not only to the political and practical dimensions of Cavell’s thought, but also to the oldest and deepest layers of his philosophy as a whole, found in the essays he published in Must We Mean What We Say? (1969), and in the first three parts of The Claim of Reason (1979). At the same time Norris utilizes some of Cavell’s more recent and accessible works — Cities of Words (2004), Little Did I Know (2010), and his writings on Emerson and Thoreau — to argue that Cavell offers “a way of conceiving democracy and related notions of community, voice, and friendship that promises to temper, if not avoid, the rationalism and proceduralism of Rawlsian and Habermasian approaches.” (2). Cavell may not be interested in such standard issues in political philosophy as the nature of the state or the proper distribution of a society’s resources, Norris points out, but his writing is suffused with political terms: alienation, obligation, privacy, freedom, equality, education, democracy, conformity, autonomy, and authority (4). Norris argues that Cavell’s concern with autonomy places him in the tradition of Rousseau’s Social Contract and his emphasis on the political importance of self-knowledge places him in the Socratic tradition (5).

This book contains five chapters: on ordinary language philosophy, on skepticism, and on community; then on Cavell’s engagements with Henry David Thoreau and with Ralph Waldo Emerson. I shall have something to say about all of these but shall devote myself mainly to the first, third and fifth chapters.

In Chapter One, Norris offers a detailed account of Cavell’s emergence on the philosophical scene in the mid-nineteen fifties as a defender of the “ordinary language philosophy” that he learned from J. L. Austin. “Must We Mean What We Say?”, the essay that furnishes the title of Cavell’s first book, was written for a 1957 symposium with his Berkeley colleague Benson Mates, who asked whether the philosopher of ordinary language conducts a survey or “extensional” analysis of language, or merely relies on his own personal feeling or judgment (“intensional” analysis). Cavell’s response escapes the dilemma. Ordinary language philosophy is neither first person singular (“intensional”) nor third person plural (“extensional”) but “first-person plural, the voice of the community” (30). This is the nub of the argument that runs through Norris’s first three chapters: that already in understanding language in the way Cavell does, “community” appears. Crucial for Cavell’s account of this understanding is that every native speaker is as much an authority as any other on the language they speak.

Norris gives a helpfully clear and informed account of Cavell’s turn to Kant’s Critique of Judgment in “Aesthetic Problems of Modern Philosophy,” the third essay in Must We Mean? The focus is on Kant’s analysis of our judgments of beauty as both subjective and universal: “subjective in the sense that they are expressions of the state of the judging subject, and not the application of a rule, but universal in. . . that they have a necessity and a ‘general validity’ that expressions of the immediate sensual pleasure of the subject lack” (32).

And what if people do not agree on what is beautiful, as is often the case? What if people do not agree about what makes sense and what doesn’t in ordinary language? In such cases, Norris argues, aptly transposing language from The Claim of Reason, my authority has not been abolished, but it has been “restricted.” The authority to speak for the community is based on me and on us. As Cavell thinks of it in “Knowing and Acknowledging,” the ninth essay in Must We Mean?, the first person plural grammar of the claims I make in these cases requires both that I and other people be acknowledged:

in the philosophy that proceeds from ordinary language, understanding from inside is methodologically fundamental. Because the way you must rely on yourself as a source of what is said when, demands that you grant full title to others as sources of that data — not out of politeness, but because the nature of the claim you make for yourself is repudiated without that acknowledgment (41-2).

Now keeping in mind these parallel structures or grammars — shared by the “philosophy that proceeds from ordinary language” and our judgments of beauty — we can look ahead to Norris’s main thesis as stated in his third chapter, “Community and Voice”: “As the ordinary language philosopher’s authoritative use of the first-person plural reflects her life in the common language, so the citizen qua citizen speaks not only for herself and her private interests, but for the group of which she is a part” (97).

If Austin and Mates are central to the first chapter, Cavell’s relationship with another Berkeley colleague, Thompson Clarke, is a highlight of Chapter Two. Clarke helped Cavell to see that there is “a truth in skepticism” that Austin had not registered. And reading Wittgenstein seriously for the first time along with Clarke, Cavell learned to “contrast Austin’s inability to hear the truth in the skeptic’s claim with Wittgenstein’s incorporation of those claims into a philosophical conversation — what Cavell will later call the argument of the ordinary” (53). Whereas Clarke argued that skepticism is an historical phenomenon that would eventually be abandoned, Cavell, Norris argues, came to see skepticism as a “a permanent possibility.” “The truth of skepticism,” Norris writes in a useful summary, “is that our relation to the world as such is one of acceptance and acknowledgment, and of their absence or failure, and not of knowledge as we have understood it.” (77). There is much else of interest in this chapter, including a knowing discussion of Cavell’s debts to Heidegger’s Being and Time. Still, the reader may feel that the thread of the political argument has been left hanging.

The book’s third chapter, “Community and Voice,” picks up the thread again. Following Cavell in the early pages of The Claim of Reason, Norris argues that speaking for oneself politically is making a claim to community (113) and that political claims require the confirmation of others: “one claims to speak authoritatively for the community, and does so on the basis of no independent source or impersonal authority” (114). Cavell defends the idea of rational disagreement in politics, but also the idea that “the claim to community is always a search” (116). That search may take the form of provocation, a word and idea whose Emersonian use in “The American Scholar” is inscribed in the epigraph to The Claim of Reason: “Truly speaking, it is not instruction, but provocation, that I can receive from another soul.” “To provoke,” Cavell writes, “is not to instruct one who knows less than you, but to challenge and arouse or wake the other, to call him forth and incite him to speech and action, if only by inciting his resentment” (122).

I can only briefly mention some of the other topics Norris treats in his rich discussion of community and voice. He takes a cue from Cavell in invoking Rousseau’s general will as something autonomous — given to oneself — but also subject to the consent of the community. He offers careful discussions of Cavell’s critique of John Rawls in Conditions Handsome and Unhandsome, observing that Cavell’s concern is “not with the principles dictating the basic structure of society, as in Rawls, but with the individual’s life in the society” (127). He wisely seeks guidance from Cities of Words, where Cavell writes that

even when Rawls’s veil of ignorance is lifted we still do not know what ‘position’ we occupy in society, who we have turned out to be, what our stance is toward whatever degree of compliance with justice we have reached. . . The idea of conversation expresses my sense that one cannot achieve this perspective alone (129).

(Norris might here have considered the focus on conversation (and the lack of it) in Cavell’s two books on Hollywood film, Pursuits of Happiness: The Hollywood Comedy of Remarriage and Contesting Tears: The Melodrama of the Unknown Woman.)

Chapters Four and Five consider Thoreau and Emerson, respectively. The political approach of both writers, Norris observes, begins “with the individual agent, and not institutions, social forces, or historical structures” (153). Both are concerned with the dangers that alienation poses for democracy — a form of government that, unlike oligarchy, fascism, or aristocracy, relies on “the activity of the people. Only in democracy, where the people rule, are people as a whole allowed and indeed called upon to actively participate in public life” (143). A particularly Emersonian term for this call to public life is attraction, which Cavell characterizes (in “Finding as Founding”) as “the rightful call we have on one another.”1

Norris’s rich chapter on Emerson, “Receiving Autonomy,” registers the emphasis Emerson places on reception, as when he writes at the end of “Experience”: "All I know is reception; I am and I have: but I do not get . . . " (CW 2:48).2 (This is part of a passage Cavell cites in claiming that Emerson’s philosophy runs counter to the pragmatist emphasis on action.) Norris tracks the tie between reception and Cavell’s response to skepticism. “It is true,” Cavell writes, “that we do not know the existence of the world with certainty; our relation to its existence is deeper — one in which it is to be accepted, that is to say, received. My favorite way of putting this is to say that existence is to be acknowledged” (190). Acknowledgment or acceptance are the reverse of the clutching and grasping that Emerson characterizes in “Experience” as the most “unhandsome part of our condition” (210). Though clutching is designed to achieve certainty and control, things tend “to slip through our fingers then when we clutch hardest” (CW 2:29). Norris draws the political lesson:

What needs to be overcome is the desire to master the world and those with whom we share it, to grasp and control them rather than suffering their difference and exposing ourselves to the possible inadequacy of our response to them. . . As in Heidegger, overcoming the drive to mastery is in Cavell at once an ethical, political, and philosophical task (191).

A key sentence from Emerson’s “History” provides what is for Cavell an exemplary statement of Emersonian Perfectionism: “So all that is said of the wise man by stoic or oriental or modern essayist, describes to each reader his own idea, describes his unattained but attainable self” (CW 2:5). The turn in this sentence is from what the wise man says to the application of such wisdom by or to the reader or listener. Perfectionism as Cavell conceives it relies on our attraction to people, texts, and principles, and to our own “next self.” It is “the dimension of moral thought directed less to restraining the bad than to releasing the good, as from a despair of good” (209). In the political sphere, Norris argues, the “exemplary other,” the one who attracts us, “takes the place of Rousseau’s virtuous community [that] does not (yet) exist; it is precisely the way towards such a community that the exemplar reveals” (210).

A few critical remarks. I wondered whether Norris might have explored Cavell’s anguished discussion of the Vietnam War in “The Avoidance of Love: A Reading of King Lear.” That essay has other political resonances too, dealing as it does with a weak king who pays bribes for false love, and whose avoidance of self-knowledge spawns the tragedy. Norris mostly confines his attention to Cavell’s breakthrough essay, “Thinking of Emerson,” of which he gives an excellent account, but he doesn’t have much to say about other important essays on Emerson, such as, “Aversive Thinking,” “Being Odd, Getting Even,” “Finding as Founding,” and “Emerson’s Constitutional Amending: Reading ‘Fate’.”

When discussing reception’s relationship to power Norris writes: “Self-reliance, as Cavell has it, is itself the exercise not of power but of reception” (212). One must remember here that there are different kinds of power in Emerson: the raw animal spirits of the “bruisers” who bully their way through life, but also the power of the thinker or poet. The latter but not the former find their power through reception or abandonment, as Emerson states in “The Poet”:

It is a secret which every intellectual man quickly learns, that, beyond the energy of his possessed and conscious intellect, he is capable of a new energy . . . by abandonment to the nature of things; that, beside his privacy of power as an individual man, there is a great public power, on which he can draw, by . . . suffering the ethereal tides to roll and circulate through him: then he is caught up into the life of the Universe, his speech is thunder, his thought is law, and his words are universally intelligible . . . (CW 2:5).

This sort of power is to be contrasted with weakness, shame, and conformity, but not with reception.

A third, smaller point concerns Thoreau’s announced goal of waking his neighbors up. He does so in various ways, e. g. by pointing out their self-torture and lives of anxiety, but also by showing them his own life at Walden. “I do not propose to write an ode to dejection,” Thoreau writes, “but to brag as lustily as chanticleer in the morning, standing on his roost, if only to wake my neighbors up.” Norris takes from this and other quotations the idea that “if waking up means becoming conscious, then one must first become conscious of one’s lack of consciousness . . . of the fact that we are not yet thinking” (156). But might one not simply wake up, surprised, and see one’s old non-thinking life for the first time? When Thoreau writes that morning is the time when we may be “awakened by our own newly-acquired force and aspirations from within,” there is no suggestion that the awakening must be preceded by anything more than the renewed “cheerful invitation” of the dawn. And in the moment of “perfect exhilaration” that Emerson records in Nature, he is walking on the common “without having in my thoughts any occurrence of special good fortune” (CW 1:10) — nor any thoughts of a fundamental lack.

To conclude: this is a deeply researched, clearly written, engaging and provocative book. There are insights on every page, and Norris is especially good at recovering the early California Cavell of Mates, Clarke, and Austin, integrating Rousseau’s version of the social contract with ordinary language philosophy, and articulating and defending Cavell’s Emersonian Perfectionism.

1 Stanley Cavell, Emerson’s Transcendental Etudes, ed. David Justin Hodge, Stanford University Press, 2003, 117.
2 References to Collected Works of Ralph Waldo Emerson (ed. Robert Spiller, Alfred R. Ferguson, et al, 10 vols., Harvard University Press, 1971-2013) are incorporated in the text.