Before Forgiveness: The Origin of a Moral Idea

Placeholder book cover

David Konstan, Before Forgiveness: The Origin of a Moral Idea, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 192pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521199407.

Reviewed by Ilaria L.E. Ramelli, Catholic University of the Sacred Heart, Milan


The main point made in this fine monograph is that the modern notion of interpersonal forgiveness, which is quite important today in religion, law, politics, and psychotherapy, was altogether absent from the classical world, both Greek and Roman. What is more, it seems to have not been fully developed in the Bible, ancient Judaism, or early Christianity either, where the focus was more on God's forgiveness than on human, interpersonal forgiveness. In fact, according to the author, the birth of the modern concept of forgiveness should be traced back just to the past three or four centuries.

Chapter 1 helpfully clarifies what Konstan means by "the modern concept of forgiveness," which is not a simple notion, but is part of a constellation of ethical and emotional concepts. First, in order for A to forgive B, B must have done wrong to A, bear some responsibility for that, acknowledge the wrong, and manifest remorse, confession, and a change of the self; and A must be aware of the wrong or be reminded of it. Konstan clearly shows the difference between this process and the process of supplication in the ancient world. He also warns that contemporary uses of the word "forgiveness" have a broader semantic spectrum than that covered by the aforementioned definition.

Chapters 2 and 3 focus on the absence of forgiveness in the Greco-Roman world, where other means of reconciliation and of appeasing anger were at work. Chapter 2 begins, accordingly, with a discussion of Aristotle's treatment, in his Rhetoric, of πραότης as a means of appeasing anger (ὀργή). Konstan argues that in this treatment the matter is not of offense, repentance, forgiveness; but rather of a belittlement, denying a belittlement (by humbling oneself, etc.), appeasing of anger. A parallel case is made for Aristotle's treatment of συγγνώμη in the Nicomachean Ethics: even though the term is generally translated "forgiveness," it instead indicates pardoning and excusing, for the wrongdoer argues that he acted involuntarily; there is no question of an admission of responsibility (more detailed discussions on Aristotle's treatment of emotions are found in Konstan's The Emotions of the Ancient Greeks, Toronto, 2006). The notion of forgiveness is absent from the other philosophers as well, Plato and the Stoics in particular. Greek and Latin juridical literature treating συγγνώμη and ignoscere is also bereft of any idea of forgiveness.

The rest of the analysis is devoted to the use of συγγνώμη, ignoscere, and related terms in non-technical literature, such as tragedy, comedy, or history. The wrongdoer regularly rejects responsibility and points to extenuating factors such as ignorance, passions, external compulsion, and the like; there is no question of repentance and forgiveness.

Remorse and repentance played little role in Greek and Roman narratives of reconciliation, but Greeks and Romans had other ways to be reconciled and appease anger. To show this, Chapter 3 analyzes Greek and Latin texts which may be taken to involve forgiveness, though this -- Konstan argues -- is not the case. For instance, when Agamemnon wants Achilles to be reconciled with him, he does not admit his responsibility, but excuses his behavior by adducing a moment of god-sent madness. In the same way, Adrastus' suicide for having killed Croesus' son does not come from any remorse, since he acted involuntarily, as Croesus himself acknowledges. There are extensive examinations of scenes from Menander and other texts, including the little-known second- and third-centuries AD "Confession Inscriptions" from Phrygia and Lydia. Here, transgressors do not try to deny or extenuate their responsibility; they admit it and perform rituals aimed at reconciliation with the divinity. There is not, however, repentance, remorse, or the promise of a change of heart before the gods. Rather, this is the scenario in Jewish and early Christian texts.

Chapter 4 examines the Hebrew Bible, the Septuagint, the New Testament, and early Christian authors. There is also an analysis of the Life of Adam and Eve, in which especially emphasized is Eve's remorse before God, which elicits God's forgiveness. Konstan draws a well-designed contrast between this Jewish-Christian novel and the broadly contemporary Greek novels in which the notions of repentance and forgiveness are totally absent.

In the Old Testament, passages are singled out concerning sins against God, repentance, return to God, and forgiveness on God's part. Passages that might seem to refer to interpersonal forgiveness, such as the narrative of the reconciliation between Joseph and his brothers, are shown not to deal in fact with repentance and forgiveness. In the Mishnah and the Talmud, however, there are some examples of interpersonal forgiveness.

In the New Testament, the power to remit sins is a privilege of God alone, as is clear, for instance, from Matt 9:2-7; the terms, however, are ἀφίημι and ἄφεσις, which are also used of interpersonal forgiveness.[1] The terminology is the same, but the content is different as only God can cancel one's sins; this is not what is at stake in interpersonal forgiveness. Συγγνώμη and συγγιγνώσκω, on the contrary, are unrepresented in the New Testament, with just one occurrence in Paul. In the Septuagint, there are only six occurrences, all in the most recent books, and again the meaning "forgiveness" or "to forgive" proper is to be ruled out.

It is rightly recognized that repentance (μετάνοια) is emphasized in the New Testament, and I am particularly happy that the author explicitly agrees with me (119) that forgiveness is never taken as unconditional therein[2] and that Jesus' words in Lk 23:34a are very probably original and were athetized later on (as I argued in "Luke 23:34a"; Jennifer Knust and Nathan Eubank also favor the authenticity, from different perspectives[3]). Since, moreover, Jesus ascribes ignorance to his killers, it is improper to translate his words as "Father, forgive them." I proposed a different understanding: "Father, do not even impute them this sin."

Chapter 4 deals specifically with Patristic authors and notes the prominence of the theme of repentance in their writings, the importance of the notion of the so-called "original sin" or the sinful state of humanity, and the consequent necessity of a constant battle against sin. Particular attention is devoted to John Chrysostom; Evagrius might have been another, no less relevant, example of the continual fight of the ascetic against sin. All sins are first of all against God, and repentance must entail a change of heart. A way to repentance is humility, a Christian virtue that Konstan nicely analyzes.

A treatment is devoted to συγγνώμη in the Cappadocians, who were well steeped in forensic rhetoric, and the difference is highlighted between this and the idea of divine forgiveness, which especially in Gregory of Nyssa takes the form of an elimination of evil. I suspect that this particular emphasis on the part of Gregory is due to his belief in the eventual apokatastasis, based on his conviction, deriving from Origen and shared, for instance, by Evagrius, that evil has no ontological status and must radically disappear in the end; baptism and cancellation of sins anticipate the telos.[4] Interestingly, Konstan points out one case in which Origen -- who, I note, was very well versed in philosophy, rather than in forensic oratory -- seems to use συγγνώμη in the sense of forgiveness proper.

Konstan rightly admits that the Church Fathers did not altogether neglect interpersonal forgiveness, but through examples drawn from Origen, Gregory of Nyssa, Ephrem (Ephraem Graecus, as perhaps it might have been worth mentioning: not the original work in Syriac), Augustine, and Leo the Great, he shows that an analysis of interpersonal forgiveness is lacking and human forgiveness is modeled on divine forgiveness; it often constitutes a condition for it (one is forgiven by God if one forgives other humans). On the other hand, Konstan notes that Patristic authors, as well as classical authors, were interested in, and recommended, assuaging anger.

Konstan does not find a development of the notion and theory of interpersonal forgiveness in mediaeval authors either. He has checked Abelard, Anselm, and Aquinas; I could add more Platonizing thinkers such as John Scotus Eriugena or the so-called School of Chartres, and the result would be much the same. One might wish that Konstan had expanded a little more on mediaeval authors, who are the least analyzed in the book; some words on Dante would have been welcome, for instance. But I realize that this would have added little to the general picture.

In Chapter 6 Konstan finally endeavors to determine when and how the modern concept of forgiveness arose, and he shows how it was related to notions of moral autonomy and radical change of character and why it is based on a notion of self-transformation that may be incoherent. His point of departure is Molière's Le fourberies de Scapin, in which, in at least a couple of scenes, the series "voluntary sin, confession, remorse, request for forgiveness, forgiveness" is found. Something similar, albeit not so developed, might be already found in a scene of Shakespeare. While noting the virtual absence of forgiveness theorizing in the main seventeenth- and eighteenth-century philosophers, Konstan examines Butler's treatment of forgiveness, which he locates in the context of human resentment and desire for revenge. However, Butler seems to be uninterested in repentance and a change of heart in the offender.

Even though Kant has very little to say about interpersonal forgiveness, his moral philosophy is seen by Konstan as the framework in which that modern notion developed. Hegel's notion of forgiveness is also evaluated. Konstan reports North's analysis of the problems related with Kant's notion of "a change of the self" in the process of repentance. She remarks that, if one is a new person after repentance, forgiveness makes no more sense, in that it would address the old person. The existence of this problem is rightly endorsed by Konstan, and I personally observe that this issue is very similar, in a way, to that which was pointed out by Origen in the thought of some "Gnostics" who regarded themselves as perfect and maintained that their sin was committed not by their own, perfect and spiritual, self, but by another, lower self. This, in Origen's view, annulled responsibility and the possibility of forgiveness on the part of God. The similarity lies in the presupposition of two different selves, one that is responsible for the past sin and the other (the new self, or, in the "Gnostic" model, the spiritual self) who is thought to be free from that sin.

This, as Konstan notes, is a contradiction in the very concept of forgiveness: to forgive the past self of one's offender, which is taken to be now different and yet to belong to the same person. Such a contradiction was absent from classical models of reconciliation, which did not require a change of the offender's self; what the offenders had to demonstrate was rather that the offended person's status and dignity was in fact not diminished (hence display of self-abasement, deference, and the like). Konstan acknowledges that even in the classical world, and especially in Plato, there is some notion of a transformation of the self, but very sparse and not indicating a real ethical possibility. Such a lack of interest in the issue of the possibility of a transformation of the self is also reflected in ancient accounts of character development: children are simply portrayed as miniature prefigurations of exactly what they will become as adults. This notion of a transformation of the self seems to be much more a Christian trait. I probably needn't add that it is St. Paul who spoke of putting on the "new man" in Christ and dismissing the old one, and Paul himself became for the Christians the example of a startling transformation, in Origen's words, from "Paul the persecutor [sc. of the followers of Jesus]" to "Paul the apostle of Jesus Christ."

An additional problem with modern forgiveness, indicated by William Miller, who is quoted by Konstan, is related to the former: how can one know that a change of heart has really occurred in one's offender and one is not simply faking it? This, again, is an issue that was not found in ancient ways of reconciliation. I would like to remark that this is a problem that Thomas Aquinas seems to have already pointed out. In ST III q. 86 a. 2, the third objection is that "a human sometimes forgives another without the latter's repenting," therefore "much more does God forgive human beings without their repenting." Aquinas replies that "if a human does no penance, it seems that God will not forgive his or her sins." This is the case for God's forgiveness. But human interpersonal forgiveness "presupposes true or apparent goodness in the person who is forgiven." In order for an offended human being to forgive, it is necessary to assume that the offender has repented and improved, but one cannot know whether this is really the case. Indeed, only God knows human minds, and only God's forgiveness causes, and not only presupposes, a change of heart and improvement in the offender. Therefore, if the offender's repentance is only apparent, and in fact untrue, "it is possible for a human to forgive an offense, for which s/he is offended with someone, without any real change in the latter's will. But it is impossible for God to forgive a human without the latter's will being changed." For "God's mercy is more powerful than human mercy, in that it moves a human being's will to repent, which human mercy cannot do." Human forgiveness can only presuppose, and not cause, the offender's repentance, but sometimes this repentance may be a pretense.

This volume makes for fascinating reading and is a remarkable scholarly achievement.

[1] On the plurality of meanings of ἀφίημι in the New Testament see my "Luke 23:34a: A Case Against Its Athetesis," Sileno 36 (2010) 233-47.

[2] See my "Unconditional Forgiveness in Christianity? Some Reflections on Ancient Christian Sources and Practices," in The Ethics of Forgiveness: A Collection of Essays, ed. Christel Fricke, London-New York: Routledge, 2011, 30-48.

[3] Jennifer Knust, "Jesus' Conditional Forgiveness," in Ancient Forgiveness: Classical, Judaic, and Christian, eds. Charles Griswold and David Konstan, Cambridge University Press, forthcoming; Nathan Eubank, "A Disconcerting Prayer," Journal of Biblical Literature 129 (2010) 521-36.

[4] See my "Baptism in Gregory of Nyssa's Theology and its Orientation to Eschatology," in Ablution, Initiation, and Baptism, ed. David Hellholm, Berlin: De Gruyter 2011, 2: 1203-27; for the connection between forgiveness and the doctrine of apokatastasis, which does not entail unconditional forgiveness, see my "Forgiveness in Patristic Philosophy: The Importance of Repentance and the Centrality of Grace," in the above-cited Ancient Forgiveness.