Before Forgiving: Cautionary Views of Forgiveness in Psychotherapy

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Lamb, Sharon and Murphy, Jeffrie (eds.), Before Forgiving: Cautionary Views of Forgiveness in Psychotherapy, Oxford University Press, 2002, 304pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195145208.

Reviewed by Kathryn J. Norlock, St. Mary's College of Maryland


Although philosophical and psychological literature on forgiveness has enjoyed an unprecedented boom in the last twenty years, a survey of that literature reveals that, more often than not, these works merely advocate the practice of forgiveness and argue for its benefits, especially in psychotherapy. This volume of original contributions is an informative and intriguing attempt to change that state of affairs. Jeffrie Murphy and Sharon Lamb offer a badly needed volume in a field that still lacks critical, philosophical, and feminist analyses of the nature and merits of forgiveness, and Murphy and Lamb put together a selection of articles that “enrich discussion of the topic” admirably. It succeeds in Murphy’s (and Lamb’s) stated goal, setting discussion of forgiveness in a broader context of criticism as well as advocacy. Murphy’s other stated goals include “[throwing] a wet blanket over trendy forgiveness boosterism;” he does not, to my satisfaction, make the case that past advocacy is guilty of such poorly defended cheerleading. Although Murphy may be guilty of overstating the poorness of the case for the forgiveness movement in therapy, Murphy and Lamb do succeed in bringing together more philosophical and critical contributions than many anthologies on forgiveness; philosophers accustomed to reading through much psychology to get to philosophical treatments of the subject should find this volume satisfying since half of the twelve selections are by philosophers. Selections are by the editors, Jerome Neu, Varda Konstam, et al, Norvin Richards, Mona Gustafson Affinito, Margaret Holmgren, Bill Puka, Janice Haaken, Joshua Thomas and Andrew Garrod, Norman Care, and Janet Landman.

Lamb’s introduction, titled, “Reasons to Be Cautious about the Use of Forgiveness in Psychotherapy,” nicely summarizes the kinds of concerns that the later selections will address. She argues that unlike other anthologies on the subject, this is one in which “together naysayers and proponents take seriously the issue of whether forgiveness should be advocated.” Problems she sees in the literature include the moral risks involved in unilateral forgiveness, the lack of a consensus even among advocates with regard to defining forgiveness, and the tendency to ignore “other religious beliefs and practices;” by this last I assume she alludes to the prevalence of Christian perspectives in forgiveness literature, although she does not, herself, identify the religious belief to which “other” refers. (Indeed, it is rare for any philosopher or psychologist to note the predominance of Christian perspectives in works on forgiveness, so in this respect Lamb does more than most.) She argues that the stage theories used by advocates of forgiveness do not seem appropriate to the subject. As a philosopher, I am not prepared to say if she is correct. What’s refreshing about her observation, however, is that she calls attention to the methodology of forgiveness therapy, unusual since most advocates describe, but often do not analyze, their methods. She notes the importance of the obfuscation of “the happy and the good,” a question of pressing importance to ethicists concerned with assessing the rightness or wrongness of forgiving prior to knowing if it makes one happy. Last, and more broadly, she argues that “forgiveness theorists often ignore the context in which forgiveness occurs,” and here she engages notably with feminist concerns. This is a welcome development in a field long concerned with a traditionally feminine virtue but exhibiting a surprising paucity of feminist contribution or attention. While scores of feminist contributions can be counted in analytical discussions of anger, it is rare to find the feminist argument that attention to context and especially to power relations is needed in the study of forgiveness.

The selections that follow the introduction are divided into four parts. Part One, “When Forgiving Doesn’t Make Sense,” includes as its only selection an article by philosopher Jerome Neu. His is the only contribution devoted to investigating the influence of explanations of wrong acts on the decision to forgive. A nice result of his article’s coming first is that since it rejects, at the outset, the oft-repeated argument that to forgive is merely the same thing as to understand, it justifys immediately the importance of studying the nature of forgiveness and the need for the readings that follow. Philosophers whose research interests include the study of Elizabeth Beardsley’s work on the topic of forgiveness and understanding may be disappointed to find that Neu makes no mention of her; still, this article draws similar conclusions to Beardsley’s: that the old saying may rely on a belief in determinism, which does not preclude judgment. Neu’s contribution is metaethical and addresses critical questions about the nature of our moral judgments.

Part Two, “Forgiveness in the Therapy Hour,” is the largest portion of the book and contains fully half the selections. Although this may not sound like it would contain much of interest to philosophers interested primarily in doing conceptual analyses of forgiveness, the readings address fundamental questions about what philosophy can say about a moral emotion and should be required reading for everyone doing such work. The selections alternate between philosophical and psychological entries, and start with Murphy’s “Forgiveness in Counseling: A Philosophical Perspective.” In arguing specifically against the views of psychologist Robert Enright, whom he refers to as the “guru” of forgiveness in counseling, Murphy raises one of the most basic and important questions in the study of forgiveness: Are forgiveness and a lack of resentment consistent with self-respect, as Enright argues, since those who forgive can see their status and dignity as not threatened by such a response, or is Murphy correct that depending on the context, a failure to resent can be inconsistent with proper self-respect? Because Murphy considers that some victims have an unfortunately low opinion of their own status or worth in the first place, he sees room for the possibility that hasty forgiveness is only unthreatening insofar as such folks can’t lose what they don’t have. Here he makes the important philosophical argument that “for this reason, no universal prescription…is justified.” (This is footnoted with his observation that Enright also declines to make universal prescriptions.) Such arguments are of philosophical import to anyone interested in what moral recommendations we can make regarding forgiveness. In this article, Murphy also points out explicitly that arguments like Enright’s advocating forgiveness seem to operate from a Christian conception of “forgiveness as an internal change of heart,” which may not translate neatly into other religious and cultural traditions, another valuable addition to the wider philosophical discussion which tends to neglect perspectival analysis. The selections in this section also alternate between generally critical positions like Norvin Richards’ and views like the self-described advocacy of Margaret Holmgren. In this respect, Before Forgiving is unlike any other volume on forgiveness that I’m aware of, representing a wider spectrum of attitudes toward forgiveness in therapy and in moral life.

Part Three, “Culture and Context in Forgiveness,” breaks more new ground in forgiveness theory by including, in this already unusual collection, selections specifically addressing questions of gender as fundamentally important to evaluations of forgiveness. Sharon Lamb’s own contribution, “Women, Abuse, and Forgiveness: A Special Case” appears here. In it she examines women as a group that, like more often referenced Holocaust survivors, are a special class of victims and potential forgivers, considered “in relation to acts of violence and abuse perpetrated by men.” She points out that although crimes against women and crimes against Jews are not parallel in terms of the horror of their suffering, they are both classes of people “who may have some particular reasons not to forgive.” This is a notable example that should give readers familiar with the literature pause; the recognition of Jews suffering under Nazi oppression as an example of a group not required to forgive is commonplace even in forgiveness advocacy, whereas the recognition of women as such a group is rare. The particular reasons of the latter to refuse forgiveness are not well-investigated, or at least not well documented, and so the neglect of recognition of this group is remarkable. It is perhaps for this reason that Lamb asks the provocative question, “Why is it that we have so much trouble with the woman who will not forgive?” Readers familiar with the search for more feminist criticism of forgiveness will find this article a valuable contribution to both psychological and philosophical discourse.

Further investigation of feminist arguments is provided in the next selection by Janice Haaken’s, “The Good, the Bad, and the Ugly: Psychoanalytic and Cultural Perspectives on Forgiveness.” Although neither Lamb nor Haaken cite in their bibliographies Judith Boss’ similar observations in “Throwing Pearls Before Swine,” they arrive at some of the same conclusions regarding the power and the promise of alternatives to forgiveness. Lamb argues forcefully that compassion could achieve some of the same goals which advocates of forgiveness identify and, at the same time, that compassion does not require the giving up of resentment. Further, she suggests that women who have been through such traumas as rape and battery may be best off learning to live with their anger in the absence of compassion. Haaken explicitly states that she wishes to avoid appraising forgiveness as good or bad and adds that the capacity to forgive is integral to many other important capacities like “the self-reflective capacities of social movements.” Still, she expresses sympathy with the wariness of the less powerful regarding forgiveness: “As oppressed groups gain the strength to speak up and claim new rights, including the right to disengage from abusive relationships, the powerful rediscover the salutary virtue of forgiveness.”

The last selection in Part Three, by Joshua Thomas and Andrew Garrod, is “Forgiveness after Genocide? Perspectives from Bosnian Youth.” Thomas and Garrod take up questions about the possibility of forgiving the unforgivable, which have long been of interest in philosophy, but consider these questions in the context of “the real-life stories of Bosnian children and adolescents who have lived through this kind of war.” Because they are constrained to consider the real application of forgiveness therapy, they are motivated to ask a question previously neglected in the literature: Is any therapy or counseling as we know it an appropriate remedy for the kinds of trauma and suffering war victims experience? Like many contributors to this volume, they suggest alternate methods of achieving the goals claimed by advocates of forgiveness, prioritizing processes of reconciliation over forgiveness therapy. Of especial interest to researchers, they provide a variety of first-person narratives and examples of individuals’ traumas, attitudes toward their wrongdoers, and differing views of forgiveness. The research on cultural differences in conceptions of forgiveness is as yet scarce, and this selection is an important contribution.

Part Four, “Perpetrators and Forgiveness,” contains just two selections, by philosopher Norman Care and by psychologist Janet Landman. These readings are valuable and rare in a field that often attends to the importance of forgiveness to forgiving agents at the expense of noticing the effects of forgiveness on those who are forgiven. In addition, they address fundamental questions about moral agency and ethical development, and in doing so take up what Care calls “forward-looking” questions concerning the kinds of individuals we are able to become, rather than the usual backward-looking questions regarding justifications of resentment. Care’s work is reminiscent of Hannah Arendt’s, since both note that forgiveness releases wrongdoers from moral pain and renews energy, restoring the peace and self-confidence he suspects is necessary for full effective agency. In large part, however, Care takes up Claudia Card’s discussion of moral luck and what he calls the “restoration of agency” problem; although forgiveness may help those whose agency is diminished by their sense of fault, he argues that those whose past bad luck structures their wills may or may not be able to recover enough to benefit from forgiveness. Care’s selection ends on a gloomy note regarding, not forgiveness per se, but the power of agents to benefit from forgiveness as profoundly as some models would suggest. Janet Landman ends the book on a more optimistic note, even as she criticizes those models like Enright’s and Joanna North’s that fall short of accounting for experiences with forgiving. Landman analyzes these models as they apply to the case of Katherine Ann Power, a radical student activist in the 1960s who became a fugitive after she was implicated in the shooting and death of a police officer during a bank robbery. In the process of her analysis, Landman provides a nice survey of previous philosophical and psychological literature on forgiveness. As a result, this selection stands alone so well as an introduction to the topic that I was almost sorry to see it last in the book instead of first. Like Care, Landman is attentive to the identity of the wrongdoer. She concludes that identity is a story, and that Power’s new identity after her process of repentance and forgiveness is the result of integration with her past, and not a break with her past as past characterizations of repentance might describe it. Her article ends with an uplifting argument for the possibility of integrity through accountability and forgivability.

In the end, this book is a novel addition to the growing field of the study of forgiveness. It satisfies the editors’ stated goals of setting forgiveness in a broader context than have past individual volumes, and calls attention to feminist and multicultural concerns through interdisciplinary and accessible readings. Although some of the readings are more appropriate for audiences already familiar with the literature and with the forgiveness movement in psychotherapy, the anthology on the whole is useful to anyone with an interest in the metaethical and ethical questions surrounding forgiveness. It was challenging to my undergraduate students and valuable to my own research. I can only hope this inspires more philosophers to approach forgiveness from critical, feminist and multicultural perspectives.