Before Tomorrow: Epigenesis and Rationality

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Catherine Malabou, Before Tomorrow: Epigenesis and Rationality, Carolyn Shread (tr.), Polity, 2016, 223pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780745691510.

Reviewed by Christopher Watkin, Monash University


Some of the most exhilarating philosophical reads, as well as some of the most important and memorable, combine three elements relatively simple to achieve in isolation but rarely found together: sinuous and detailed engagement with texts and ideas, an authoritative and expansive breadth, and a clear, concisely expressed main idea. This book delivers on all three fronts. Its main idea is that epigenesis offers us a new way of understanding the Kantian transcendental and a new paradigm for philosophy in general. Its breadth is extensive, ranging over Kant, Heidegger, Quentin Meillassoux, eighteenth century biology, contemporary neurobiology and the present state and future prospects of European philosophy. Its sinuous engagement comes in extended discussions of Paragraph 27 of Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, and of Heidegger's account of time and synthesis.

In her introduction Catherine Malabou explains that her book is about three related subjects, each of which she introduces with a question. The future of European thought is discussed in terms of the query "Why has the question of time lost its status as the leading question of philosophy?" (1). The second subject, namely the relation between philosophy and science, responds to the question "Why does philosophy continue to ignore recent neurobiological discoveries that suggest a profoundly transformed view of brain development and that now make it difficult, if not unacceptable, to maintain the existence of an impassable abyss between the logical and the biological origin of thinking?" (1) Finally, "The third question concerns Kant's status. This is the first time that the authority of Kant -- the guarantor, if not the founder, of the identity of Continental philosophy -- has been so clearly up for discussion, from within this same philosophical tradition" (2). The common thread drawing together these three concerns is the Kantian transcendental or a priori (Malabou sees no fundamental difference between the two terms).

In Paragraph 27 of Kant's first Critique Malabou primarily focuses on the phrase "the epigenesis of pure reason". What does Kant mean by this in relation to the a priori categories of the understanding? Is this a clue to the Kantian account of the genesis of the transcendental that his thought owes us? After all, Malabou notes, the Transcendental Deduction fails to explain the genesis of the transcendental as such, a lacuna with which philosophy has been struggling ever since. Recourse to "epigenesis", she explains, allows Kant to avoid two equally unappealing alternatives. The first is the idealist thesis that the categories of the understanding fit with the objects of experience because the categories are innate, implanted presumably by some deity in all human beings and fine-tuned to accord exactly with those objects. The second alternative is the equally unattractive skeptical thesis that the categories are more or less arbitrary, "machine-made" artificial constructions. In other words, either the categories are implanted in an utterly transcendental and somewhat mystical preformation, or they are not transcendental at all. This innate/constructed dichotomy is the first of a number of oppositions Malabou seeks to overcome in the course of the book.

Malabou fixes on Kant's brief reference to epigenesis as a way out of this dilemma:

I shall push the Kantian thesis to its limit: what if, in the end, the agreement of the categories of thought with the real were simply the fruit of biological adaptation, an evolutionary process at the origin of the theory that some neurobiologists call "mental Darwinism"? (34)

She follows the development of the epigenesis motif through Kant's three critiques, from its embryonic form in the Critique of Pure Reason to its blossoming, in the Critique of the Power of Judgment, into an acknowledgment that the categorical structures are modified upon encounter with life. This part of the book is precise, sure-footed and authoritative: Malabou is at her gleaming best when she is jousting over details of Kant, and she takes no prisoners.

She then turns to science. To be sure, one reason for Malabou's appeal to scientific theories of epigenesis is to help her elaborate the notion of the transcendental she finds in Kant, but she also feels compelled to do so because, for too long, "continental philosophy has cut itself off from any scientific concerns" (140). She dwells on two moments from the history of science to broaden and defend her thesis that the origin of the Kantian transcendental is to be understood epigenetically. The first is eighteenth- and nineteenth-century theories of epigenesis, and the second is late twentieth- and early twenty-first century epigenetics.

In terms of the development of organisms, eighteenth- and nineteenth-century biology offer a dichotomous choice between "equivocal generation" and "preformationism". Equivocal generation argues that life emerges spontaneously from lifeless matter (like flies from the carcass of a dead animal) without rhyme or reason, and is summarily dismissed by Malabou as "a theoretical monstrosity that warrants no further consideration" (22). Preformation is the theory according to which all the form of an embryo is fully developed from its embryonic stage, gradually unfolding over time according to the dictates of a pre-programmed "code" but without being changed by outside factors. Once more, epigenesis offers Malabou a way through this dichotomy without falling into either of its extreme positions.

Moving forward to the epigenetic revolution of recent decades, Malabou's position is once more structured in terms of a false dichotomy, this time between the "cognitivism" of Jean-Pierre Changeux and Paul Ricœur's account according to which the brain is "[nothing but] the substrate of thought" (1). Changeux plays the skeptic insofar as his neural Darwinism cuts epigenesis off from its transcendental anchoring, arguing as he does that even the truth of mathematics is an a posteriori truth of evolution. For Changeux there is nothing in the brain that might correspond to the transcendental. Ricœur, for his part, is cast in the role of the idealist, arguing that the mind maintains a magisterially transcendental relation to the brain.

Malabou's way through this dichotomy, following an indication from Ricœur, is to develop the idea of epigenesis as interpretation. Meaning is a game changer: "isn't meaning what makes it possible to reassert the resistance of the transcendental to its biologization?" (99). If epigenetics is hermeneutic, akin to the interpretative performance of a musical piece, then it cannot be collapsed into a pre-determined score. For Malabou, epigenetics as hermeneutics "transcends strict determinism and places epigenesis and the development of all living beings in an intermediary space between biology and history" (89). Overall, the importance of Malabou's engagement with modern and contemporary science emerges in her insistence that epigenesis is not merely a new analogy to help us understand the transcendental or a new image to describe it, but a new paradigm for philosophy (180), a paradigm which she unfolds in her critique of, and proposals for, philosophy's future.

Malabou frames her account of the epigenetic transcendental in terms of "a panorama of the ultra-contemporary philosophical landscape" (xiv), with the result that her book reads in places like a philosophical manifesto. Her summary of its current state is not flattering, and she argues that Continental philosophy remains incapable of knowing what to do with the Kantian transcendental: "ought we to save it or deconstruct it, transform it or derive it, temporalize it or destroy it?" (129). This impasse has issued in an unseemly face-off today between a hyper-normative idealism that desperately seeks to shore up the transcendental, and a hypo-normative skepticism that dances on its grave.

The cannons of Malabou's critique fire in multiple directions: "Destruction-deconstruction" has become bogged down "the contemporary impoverishment of philosophy, condemned for so long to poetic-messianic waiting" (184). As for "speculative realism" (by which Malabou means Meillassoux's After Finitude), it is ultimately incapable of offering the slightest content -- be it theoretical or practical -- to the idea of radical contingency. In short, nobody is answering "the current demand for a rigorous post-critical philosophical rationality" (15).

Meillassoux's After Finitude occupies the skeptical place in Malabou's recurring skeptical/idealist dichotomy (the idealist spot being taken -- somewhat problematically -- by Derridean messianicity). Meillassoux's now famous argument about "correlationism" and its inability to account for "ancestral" time are, Malabou convincingly argues, based on a misreading of Heidegger. Meillassoux assumes that the synthesis of anteriority and posteriority in Heidegger must be "necessarily related to a psyche, a subject or an 'I think'" (112) which, in Heidegger, it is not. Meillassoux again assumes that the early Heidegger and the late Heidegger are identical, missing Heidegger's own post-Kehre critique of the transcendental. In other words, he fails to see that philosophy itself develops epigenetically (159, 181). Malabou confronts Meillassoux's mistake with a lapidary question: after which finitude? (137).

Her own response to the crisis of the transcendental is to insist that "the relinquishing of Kant must be negotiated with him, not against him" (15), for in turning to Kant's own account of epigenesis we can find a way to think the transcendental that avoids the dichotomy between idealism and skepticism. If, as Malabou notes, Meillassoux's After Finitude could be entitled "After Kant", then Before Tomorrow can be considered as "Kant after Kant", or "the future of Kant" (xiv, translation altered).

Malabou's three questions and responses can be summarized in tabular form:


Area of investigation


False dichotomy

Malabou's response

The future of Continental thought

Why has the question of time lost its status as the leading question of philosophy?

Hyper-normative messianic time (idealism) or Meillassoux's hypo-normative factiality (skepticism)

"the relinquishing of Kant must be negotiated with him and not against him" (15)

Neurobiology and philosophy


Why does philosophy continue to ignore recent neurobiological discoveries?

Equivocal generation (skeptical occasionalism) or preformationism (idealism)

Epigenetics is more important than genetics

Changeux's "cognitivism" (skepticism) or Ricœur's "substrate" account (idealism).

Epigenetics as interpretation


This is the first time that the authority of Kant has been so clearly up for discussion, from within this same philosophical tradition.

The transcendental is either innate and given (preformation: idealism), or artificial and manufactured ("machine-made": skepticism)

"transcendental epigenesis is the epigenesis of the transcendental itself" (157)

Overall, this is a very impressive book. Like a virtuoso conductor Malabou brings Kant, Foucault, Changeux, Meillassoux, Heidegger, Ricœur and others to resonate together in an impressively coherent and broad ensemble. The book also tidies up some deficiencies in Malabou's earlier engagements with neurobiology,[1] for whereas notions such as destructive plasticity always rely on the good will of Malabou's reader to survive the transition from neuroscience to philosophy, the case for epigenesis as a philosophical paradigm is -- to my mind at least -- more robust and persuasive. It is amusing (and little more) to speculate on the extent to which we can now talk about an "early Malabou" of plasticity and a "later Malabou" of epigenesis. If such a periodization takes itself too seriously it will inevitably trip over its own shoelaces, for Malabou insists that philosophical development itself should be understood epigenetically (159).

Some readers may have relatively minor quibbles with aspects of the book: Has "ultra-contemporary" Continental philosophy really "cut itself off from any scientific concerns" (140)? What about Bruno Latour for starters? What about Michel Serres? Similarly, the lapidary judgment that "Destruction-deconstruction has become bogged down in the infinite poetization of a dreary messianic temporality" (14) flattens out the more nuanced (but still suspicious) interpretation of the Derridean messianic we find in Malabou's previous work.[2] We might suspect, in both these cases, that contemporary thought is being dismissed a little summarily. Malabou is not alone, of course, in offering unfavourable and perhaps ungenerous readings of those from whom she wants to distance her own thought, but it is still a shame.

More substantial critiques of Malabou's position will no doubt continue to emerge over time, and here I will sketch the lineaments of only one such possible contestation. Malabou is disappointed with Meillassoux's insistence that the absolute contingency of laws does not mean that they must change regularly. "The reasoning is the least convincing moment in [After Finitude]", she argues "for, after having enjoyed the thrill, it ultimately amounts to being content with the stability of the world" (146). Beneath this disagreement between Malabou and Meillassoux, however, lies a more fundamental shared assumption that threatens to undermine Malabou's critique of Meillassoux and to drag her own position into the skepticism from which she works hard to distinguish it. Meillassoux and Malabou both assume that, if the world were stable, we would perceive and understand it as such, and that if it changed we would necessarily recognize that it had changed. But would we? How do we know that the world cannot undergo hyperchaotic change without us noticing? Unless the categories of our understanding and our memories are exceptions to the possibility of change (whether hyperchaotic or epigenetic), then it seems hard to avoid the conclusion that Malabou's superficial disagreement relies on a more fundamental affinity with Meillassoux.[3]

We can further develop this argument in ways that put Malabou's position in this book in tension with her own understanding of the epigenetic development of our mental apparatus. First, by virtue of what necessity must an epigenetic development of the categories of understanding guarantee an increasing approximation to truth rather than, for example, an increased chance of survival? If the interests of truth and survival were at odds in epigenetic development, how do we know truth would win out? And if we cannot know that it would, then epigenesis is no exception to the skepticism Malabou finds in Meillassoux. Surely mental Darwinism will privilege survival over truth, rather than the other way round. Secondly, even if it did privilege truth, how could we know it? There is an inevitable boot-strapping involved in any attempt to exempt epigenesis from Malabou's skeptical argument. The reasoning by means of which I judge epigenetic development to provide a robust response to the charge of skepticism issues from the very apparatus which is the object of the judgment. We find ourselves in the self-congratulatory but ultimately fruitless position of determining whether our wristwatch is accurate by checking that it displays the current time, a time we have just ascertained by looking at our watch. The contention here is not over whether epigenetic development does or does not yield a non-deceptive set of categories, but over whether we could ever know for sure whether it did or not.

There have not been many books published in European philosophy in recent years of which we can say with some reasonable degree of confidence that they will continue be studied and debated decades from now. I am willing to wager that this is one of them.

[1] Notably in Catherine Malabou, What Should We Do With Our Brain?, trans. Sebastian Rand (Fordham University Press, 2008), Catherine Malabou, The New Wounded: From Neurosis to Brain Damage, trans. Steven Miller (Fordham University Press, 2012), Catherine Malabou and Adrian Johnston, Self and Emotional Life: Philosophy, Psychoanalysis and Neuroscience (Columbia University Press, 2013).

[2] See Clayton Crockett and Catherine Malabou, "Plasticity and the Future of Philosophy and Theology", Political Theology 11:1 (2010) 15-34; Catherine Malabou, Counterpath: Travelling With Jacques Derrida (Stanford University Press, 2004); "Another possibility", Research in Phenomenology 36 (2006): 115 -- 29.

[3] I elaborate this "split rationality critique" in relation to Meillassoux at some length in Difficult Atheism: Post-Theological Thinking in Alain Badiou, Jean-Luc Nancy and Quentin Meillassoux (Edinburgh University Press, 2011) chapter 4.